Le procès de l'histoire. Fondements et postérité de l'idéalisme historique de Hegel

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Christophe Bouton, Le procès de l'histoire. Fondements et postérité de l'idéalisme historique de Hegel, Libraire Philosophique J. Vrin, 2004, 320 pp, 32 € (pbk), ISBN 271161655X.

Reviewed by Martin Thibodeau, University of Chicago


As its subtitle indicates, Christophe Bouton's book primarily deals with Hegel's philosophy of history. But it more broadly copes with the development of the whole issue of history, which has become increasingly more important in modern and contemporary philosophical thinking since Kant and the period of German Idealism. Though, Bouton notes, the theme of history had figured significantly in the works of earlier philosophers -- for example, in the work of Vico -- there is here the intimation that history became a genuine philosophical issue only in the later eighteenth century. The question thus arises: Why in this particular time of European history does a turn to the philosophical investigation of history become so prominent? Why is it that philosophers emphasize this issue at this peculiar time, which, of course, is the time of the French Revolution? And what are the themes, the motives around which this philosophical investigation of history turns?

According to Bouton the issue of history should be understood in regard to two opposite views. The first one, which could be called the thesis, holds that history -- i.e., the temporal becoming and unfolding of the life of human beings, individually and/or collectively -- is something meaningful, intelligible, and should somehow be thought of as an evolutionary progress heading towards a certain goal or end. In contradistinction to this, the other conception, which could be designated as the antithesis, claims that history, because it is submitted to time and becoming, is meaningless rather than meaningful, unintelligible than intelligible, irrational than rational. According to this view, history is certainly a becoming, albeit a chaotic and fragmented one. It ought therefore to be more accurately conceived as an oscillatory movement of progress and regress. Now this opposition, claims Bouton, is in reality much more complex than the mere assertion of these two irreconcilable conceptions. Indeed its complexity becomes apparent when one, for example, asks the defender of the thesis: What is the driving force of history? For Bouton, there are two possible answers to this question: The first maintains that history's sense is beyond human understanding. It has its source in either God -- which is the principle founding the providentialist conception of history -- or nature -- which is the principle founding the "naturalist" view of history. The second answer to this question maintains that history's sense is rather the product of individuals and peoples, the result of human action, freedom, and reason. This view can then be called the "practical" or "rationalist" conception of history.

Analogously, the antithesis is also double-sided. The senselessness of history can either be attributed to a force or a power that escapes human reason -- a fate or a destiny -- or it can be thought of as the result of man's irrational and destructive behavior. This last view might well be designated as the "pessimistic" conception of history. According to Bouton, these two double-sided conceptions form what he calls -- using a Kantian terminology -- the antinomy of history. Thus it is precisely this antinomy that will be at the core of the different philosophies of history that emerge in the context of the French Revolution. Of course, it is this same antinomy that he will use, so to speak, as a conduit for his analysis of these philosophies. And for Bouton -- this is the larger claim that he seeks to make in this book -- the emergence of the Post-Kantian, and, more specifically, of the Hegelian philosophy of history marks the moment where history will cease to be understood as an overwhelming power which people are submitted to -- whether it is "Fate", "Nature", or "Providence" -- and will instead be thought of as something made by human reason, action, and freedom. This moment, which in his view is epitomized by Hegel's philosophy of history, coincides with what he describes as "une montée en puissance de l'idée de liberté" (p.31).

Bouton's book is divided into three main sections. Its first part, which contains two chapters, starts with a brief examination of the debate between Condorcet and Rousseau on the meaning and finality of history. It then turns towards German philosophers, and focuses on Herder, Kant, Schelling and Fichte's philosophies of history. Bouton runs rather quickly through the philosophies of these authors, for his purpose is not to carefully scrutinize the specifics of their positions on history, but to give an overall account of the development of the antinomy of history before Hegel. In his view, this development is driven by the growing awareness among German philosophers that both positions -- the thesis and the antithesis -- are in themselves flawed, one-sided, and insufficient. On the one side, the thesis -- advocated by Condorcet and other representatives of eighteenth-century Enlightenment -- according to which history should be understood as constant progress toward technical mastery, morality, and happiness of Humankind is obviously grounded in a too optimistic, and ultimately unfounded, belief in human reason. This view is also too "abstract" in the sense that it fails to take into account that people not only belong to Humankind but that they also are members of a particular culture, a particular people and nation. The antithesis, on the other side -- which maintains that the course of history is inevitably and fatally oriented toward destruction and chaos -- amounts to nothing but a complete denial of human freedom. According to this skeptical and pessimistic perspective, human beings are essentially seen as blindly and unknowingly acting in favor of their own destruction, which then ultimately means that they actually play no significant role, or at least no conscious role, in the course of what is nonetheless the product of their own decisions and actions.

For Bouton, these are the insufficiencies that German philosophers will seek to overcome. However, he maintains, it will in fact fall to Hegel to rethink them anew and thus to come up with a deeply original solution to the antinomy of history. It is this solution that he will examine in the second part of the book (chapters three to seven). Hence Hegel's philosophy of history, notes Bouton, owes much to his predecessors. For instance it recuperates and reformulates Herder's notion of the "spirit of the people"(Volksgeist). From Kant, but mostly from Fichte and Schelling, Hegel borrows the idea that the course of history is at once irreversible and unpredictable because both its motor and ultimate goal are grounded in human action and freedom. And, finally, with Kant, Fichte, and Schelling, he sees the French Revolution as the exemplary political event showing that people can literally undertake to transform their world and make history. Nevertheless, claims Bouton, Hegel's philosophy of history could and should be seen as the most original, insightful, and comprehensive solution to the antinomy of history. This claim is convincing, for Hegel's philosophy could precisely be described as a philosophy that undertakes to unite the two opposite conceptions of this antinomy in an all-encompassing thesis according to which history is the theater of human action, i.e., the theater wherein people, given the circumstances which they are put into, act in order to realize their freedom, individually and collectively.

But if this is correct -- and with Bouton, I believe it is -- then it means that the appropriate philosophical understanding of history must necessarily be grounded in a theory of action, and more specifically in a theory that demonstrates that, individually and collectively, human agency is fundamentally free. People's actions are certainly determined by nature, external circumstances, and also by traditions, customs, and habits. But at the same time, they can be said to be the product of a free will, a will that can negate and transform these determinations, and therefore reshape itself a different world and create new laws and new institutions. This is, claims Bouton, the core of Hegel's theory of action grounding his philosophy of history. In the third chapter of his book, he analyses this theory at the level of individual agency, while in chapter four he extends it to the collective level and shows how Hegel conceives individual action as being necessarily embedded in a people's set of practical, ethical, and political institutions.

Once having clarified these elements, Bouton then undertakes to examine the specifics of Hegel's philosophy of history. In chapter five he focuses on one particular concept, the concept of work (Arbeit). Going against the grain of a well-established tradition that understands Hegel's philosophy of history as essentially derived from the more or less infamous idea of the "cunning of reason", Bouton rightly points out that it is rather the notion of work that forms its center. However, this notion, he contends, should not be thought of according to the models of craftsmanship in industrial production. Historical events are not some kind of a raw material waiting to be shaped by people, but are rather already informed by human reason and action. In chapter six, he deepens his inquiry by analyzing certain key Hegelian concepts, including the concept of Geist, and he examines how it is linked to history. And in chapter seven he completes his analysis of Hegel's philosophy of history, first, by dealing with some famous Hegelian notions such as World's history (Weltgeschichte) and World 's tribunal (Weltgericht), and, second, by shedding some light on what he believes are the underlying models supporting Hegel's understanding of World's historical becoming and development. In Bouton's view, this conception draws upon three complementary models: the French Revolution, Christianity, and Greek tragedy. Admittedly, these models may suggest different and perhaps conflicting interpretations, but beyond their differences, they are all meant to describe history as a process aiming towards the realization of freedom in ethical and political institutions as they become more and more appropriate to its idea.

Finally, in the third and last part of his book, Bouton focuses on the aftermath, the "posterity" of this philosophical questioning regarding history, and raises the question of the present relevance of Hegel's philosophy of history. Hence after scrutinizing Marx's materialist solution to the antinomy of history, he deals with Dilthey's historicism, and finishes with some comments on more recent attempts to cope with this issue, such as Benjamin's and Adorno's philosophy of history. This posterity, notices Bouton, has developed itself as a harsh critique of Hegel. Indeed numerous Post-Hegelian philosophers have criticized Hegel's philosophy of history as being founded on an unjustified and too optimistic belief in human reason. And on the basis of this criticism a larger number of them have rather taken sides with the antithesis of the antinomy of history. For Bouton, this reversal of Hegel's position was certainly advocated on a theoretical and philosophical level, but was also justified, he argues, on the ground of empirical and historical events. In other words, if the French Revolution was for Hegel the historical event proving that people were indeed able to make their history and to realize their freedom, for Post-Hegelians, and especially for twentieth-century Post-Hegelians, the two World Wars and Auschwitz were the empirical demonstrations that the history of Humankind was rather a theater of chaos and destruction.

Bouton's book ought to be considered a major contribution to both the understanding of the development of the issue of history in modern and contemporary philosophy and of Hegel's philosophy of history as such. Indeed, it persuasively demonstrates how the whole philosophical questioning of history will revolve around what he designates and defines as the antinomy of history. One should add that Bouton's interpretation of Hegel's philosophy of history makes convincing arguments on a number of key issues. He argues that Hegel's philosophy of history should neither be reduced to the notion of the "cunning of reason" nor to the thesis -- a view still frequently advocated -- according to which it could be understood as a piece of secularized Christian eschatology. Both these views, he claims, simply ignore the most important notion of Hegel's philosophy, which is none other than freedom. Hegel's philosophy, he rightly claims, is a philosophy that has undertaken to define the conditions under which the idea of freedom could be said to be realized. And these conditions are necessarily historical. In other words, freedom in its Hegelian sense is a task assigned to humans who in historically determined circumstances act and struggle to fashion their ethical and political institution in accordance with what they have come to see as their own legitimate requirements.

In this respect, however, Bouton's argument would have been even more effective if he allowed a greater importance to the tragic model underlying Hegel's philosophy of history. Indeed, Bouton understands Hegel's reappropriation of Greek tragedy as essentially concerned with the concept of tragic fate, and he contends that this concept is meant to underscore the limits of human reason and freedom. But, in fact, Hegel's reappropriation of tragedy is not limited to this aspect; it also draws heavily on another key element of Greek tragic plays, namely the notion of conflict, battle, or struggle. And it could be argued that it is precisely this aspect that Hegel has reformulated in the vocabulary of his dialectical philosophy of human action and history. Had Bouton given greater importance to this aspect, he would have then been able to give a much more accurate and significant account of the tragic dimension underlying Hegel's dialectical philosophy of history.

This point brings me to another objection, which does not directly concern Bouton's interpretation of Hegel's thought on history as such, but rather his reading of Adorno's own version of a dialectical philosophy of history. Adorno's reformulation of the antinomy of history can certainly be said to be dialectical in the sense that it seeks to articulate and link together both the thesis and antithesis. However, he maintains, Adorno's particular emphasis on the antithesis gives to his philosophy of history such a fatalistic and pessimistic tone that it seems to leave no place at all for human freedom. Of course, such a view, contends Bouton, is largely true in regard to the tragic events that marked the twentieth century. But at the same time it seems overly one-sided, for it tends to undermine the idea that history is also the product of human action and freedom. Indeed, it is certainly true that Adorno's interpretation of the history of the Western world as a process of instrumentalization of reason sounds outrageously fatalistic and pessimistic. But this should not overshadow another aspect of his thinking which is at the core of his philosophy: Adorno's philosophical project, as he once phrased it in the introduction of his Dialectic of Enlightenment, consists in enlightening reason about itself. And in my view this is anything but fatalistic and pessimistic. However, it should be said that both these objections -- and other minor objections that could also be raised -- do not detract from this remarkable, well documented and well written study.