Le temps present. Écrits 1945-2005

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Claude Lefort, Le temps present. Écrits 1945-2005, Belin, 2007, 1041pp., €42.00 (pbk), ISBN 2701143578.

Reviewed by Miguel Vatter, Pontificia Universidad Católica de Chile


Claude Lefort has never quite made it to the rank of the French "maîtres à penser" like Sartre and Lacan, Althusser and Foucault. Nevertheless, during the second half of the 20th century he became France's most important practitioner of political theory, in the North American understanding of the term, as defined by the likes of Arendt, Strauss, and Sheldon Wolin. This volume collects over eighty texts by Lefort, written from 1945 to 2005, composed for the most part of journal and newspaper articles, interviews, and conference papers. They provide a fascinating exercise in what Foucault once called the project of an "ontology of the present."

Until his break in 1958 with the journal Socialism or Barbarism, which he founded together with Cornelius Castoriadis, Lefort was active in the "revolutionary" Left, first as a Trotskyite, later as an advocate of people's self-government in the form of workers' councils. The texts in this collection written in the thirty years from 1945 to 1975 reflect the changes that brought Lefort to completely reject what he calls the "myth" of the Revolution found in the Marxist-Leninist tradition, and to espouse the non-Marxist, yet radical democratic theory for which he is best known.

As a young Trotskyite in the late 1940s and early 1950s, Lefort became convinced early on that the Marxist-Leninist idea of revolution foundered on the twin problems of bureaucracy and organization (essentially: on the problem of the Party), as became obvious with the emergence of Stalin. This critique of communist regimes is found in his first major collection of essays of 1971, Éléments d'une critique de la bureaucratie. But it took Lefort considerably longer to develop the insight that would trigger his break with Marxism and propitiate his turn to democratic theory. The crucial insight, developed in the late 1960s with Le Travail de l'oeuvre Machiavel, is that the social is irreducible to a totality. As a consequence, the very idea of organizing society "as a whole" along the "rational" lines of a planned socialist economy was not only entirely chimerical, but worse: it brought communist regimes in line with totalitarian ones.[1] Lefort's strong thesis is that all social revolutions, in their attempt to reduce social multiplicity and conflict to what he calls the phantasm of "le peuple-Un," represented monolithically by the Party and its Leader, are conducive to the establishment of the truly new form of government that is born in the 20th century, namely, totalitarianism.

Lefort's rejection of the very idea of a social revolution, and his defense of parliamentary liberal democracy, are both determined by the more fundamental analysis of the nature of totalitarian regimes. In this sense, all of Lefort's original thought is marked, from start to finish, by the influence of Hannah Arendt who, in Origins of Totalitarianism, was one of the first to argue that both Soviet communism and Nazi-fascism had to be understood as totalitarian movements, and who was certainly the first to advocate a return to the "political" -- in the form of a radical democracy - as the only viable antidote against totalitarianism. Many of the articles collected in this book which stem from the 1970s and the early 1980s show Lefort intent on persuading the reading public about the totalitarian nature of the Soviet Union, China, Cuba and the countries of the Eastern bloc. With this move, Lefort won the enmity of all French "gauchistes" who, like Sartre and even Foucault, remained seduced by possibilities of Maoism well into the 1970s. (Lefort, instead, wrote an interpretation of the Gulag Archipelago in 1975.)

Most of the texts found in this collection, starting from 1976 onwards, are dedicated to working out the basis for the fundamental opposition that Lefort draws between totalitarianism and democracy. According to his central idea, the social is defined by a division between those who are dominated and those who dominate. Every attempt to undo this social division or conflict, to realize the utopian image of a reconciled society, thoroughly transparent to itself and therefore liable to be managed rationally, is in principle totalitarian.  Lefort argues that democracy must be conceived as that political regime which is capable of representing to society its own divisions. This democratic kind of representation, unlike the totalitarian one, is never complete; it is always liable to be called into question and replaced by another. The function of an electoral system of representative democracy is precisely that of allowing for a rotation of governments, once these, as they inevitably must, fail to interpret social divisions. Representative democracy, therefore, is the best possible regime for a society that remains "open" in the sense of "divided" and self-conflicted (see, for example, L'invention démocratique. Les limites de la domination totalitaire of 1981). The collection of essays in Le temps présent shows, in a way that I find quite indicative of the preponderant role played by "the concept of totalitarianism" (title of the longest essay in the collection, written in 1996) in his overall discourse, that Lefort continued to argue about the menace of totalitarianism well into the late 1990s and early years of our century, thus well beyond the downfall of the Soviet Union and after the narratives concerning the "end of history" had come and gone. Unlike Furet, who thought that totalitarianism was possible only on the ground of a democratic society but was also doomed to perish because its roots are plunged into such inhospitable terrain, Lefort seems to be far less convinced of the episodic nature of totalitarian regimes, and rather leans towards the idea that it is democracy which is in its essence episodic and bursts forth out of a normal state of affairs which is tendentially totalitarian.

Lefort's anti-totalitarian discourse differs from the one fashioned by liberal critics like von Hayek, Popper, or Aron in that its theoretical outlines were developed not before World War II, but well afterwards, as a way to reflect upon the meaning of anti-totalitarian revolutions, e.g., the Hungarian uprising of 1956, the 1968 uprisings throughout Europe and the United States (to which Lefort dedicates his first book, La Brèche of 1968), and the Tiananmen Square uprising. For Lefort, these uprisings prove two things. First, it is possible to conceive not only of a social revolution but also of a democratic revolution. Again and again, throughout this collection, Lefort tries to distinguish between an idea of revolution that is congenial to the institution of a totalitarian regime and an idea of revolution that is congenial to democracy. To account for this revolutionary aspect of democracy, Lefort coined the term of "savage democracy." Second, these anti-totalitarian uprisings show that a democratic revolution must have as its content, and not just as its phrase (to paraphrase Marx), a politics of human rights. In many of the essays found in this volume, particularly those written in the 1980s which reflect upon the Polish Solidarity movement, Lefort argues that both Marxism and liberalism have misinterpreted the sense of the politics that is expressed in the various declarations of the rights of man. For Lefort, these rights are not simply the ideology of the bourgeois. They cannot be reduced to rights of the homo economicus, but rather they are rights that constitute a public sphere distinct from the state. These rights set the members of society in communication with one another, allowing the society to come to understand its own multiplicity, its own divisions and conflicts. They are the only effective medium through which socialization can take place without organization or bureaucratization, and they form the only reason for a representative democracy, i.e., for a political regime which has to represent not the unity of the social, but its unavoidable conflicts. (Here one is struck by how close Lefort is to Habermas and Rawls, and yet, as far as I can tell, these names hardly appear in this collection of essays.)

The theoretical battle that Lefort engaged in during the 1980s in order to defend the idea that human rights are the content of a revolutionary democratic politics seems to have led him to appreciate, paradoxically, the political thought of Leo Strauss, at least judging from a series of essays from the 1990s found in this collection. Lefort became convinced that it was crucial to give a non-relativist, anti-historicist foundation to human rights, while at the same time it was impossible to ground them (much as Maritain, for instance, had tried) on a revival of natural law doctrine. Leo Strauss's critique of historicism and relativism, as well as his idea of a "regime," became useful to Lefort in order to think what he calls at one point the "transcendence" of the law (i.e., of human rights) with respect to the vicissitudes of democratic politics. This minimal transcendence of rights with respect to politics alone makes it possible, on his account, to claim that a democratic regime is better than a regime of any other kind. Lefort turned to Strauss in order to respond to the rise of cultural contextualism in the political discourse of the late 1980s through the present day, i.e., in order to respond to the so-called culture wars. I am not sure ultimately how felicitous this choice of ally has been for Lefort, for reasons I shall mention briefly at the very end.

The importance of transcendence in Lefort's thought is best appreciated through the last theme that appears throughout his writings on totalitarianism. This is the theme of the body. Lefort, in fact, argues that totalitarian movements rest on the belief that the law can be "incarnated" in the body of the "people," or the "party" or, finally, of the "leader" or "egocrat" (a favorite term that Lefort borrows from Solzhenitsyn). For Lefort, the image of society as a sort of mystical body identified with a head, king or Führer, lies at the root of the "theologico-political" conception of politics which democratic theory must exorcize. It does so by thinking of the social in terms of an "empty place" which no one person, collective or individual, can fill or occupy (re-present). This "empty place" can never be covered up by the symbolic: ideology is the name for that illusion of unity which occurs when the imaginary tries to fills up the holes left open in our attempt to make sense of a reality that is not in itself rational. In this aspect of Lefort's theory, apart from Merleau-Ponty's phenomenological theory of the body as flesh, one feels particularly strongly the influence of Lacan's treatment of the symbolic and Foucault's materialist interpretation of power. But it is precisely here that one also touches the limits of Lefort's theorization of the political, limits which have become more apparent in recent years. On the one hand, there is in Lefort a surprising absence of a thematization of biopolitics, and this despite his theory of the political body. On the other hand, I find that Lefort does not sufficiently problematize the "transcendence" of the law, a motif he draws from Strauss. For what is nowadays all the rage in post-Schmittian theories of the political, namely, the possibility that the transcendence of the law is, after all, intimately tied to the power of sovereignty (as opposed to its deposition), is a possibility that lies completely outside Lefort's horizon, leaving his democratic theory curiously open to being appropriated by enthusiasts of using sovereign powers in the fight for democracy and against the new "totalitarianisms" (Islamic or otherwise), and precisely in the very place (the "empty place") where it thought it had escaped the long arm of sovereign power for good.

[1] There is not much secondary literature on Claude Lefort's political thought, but recently two new books have appeared that cover the entirety of his corpus: Esteban Molina, Le défi du politique. Totalitarisme et démocratie chez Claude Lefort (L'Harmatten, 2005) and Bernard Flynn, The Philosophy of Claude Lefort: Interpreting the Political (Northwestern University Press, 2005).