Learning from Words: Testimony as a Source of Knowledge

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Jennifer Lackey, Learning from Words: Testimony as a Source of Knowledge, Oxford University Press, 2008, 295pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199219162.

Reviewed by Aaron Z. Zimmerman, University of California, Santa Barbara


Lackey's Learning from Words is a sustained examination of the nature of testimony and the knowledge we often acquire from it. Her stated goal throughout is to shift our concentration from the minds of speakers and hearers to their words. To this end, Lackey successfully argues that we can come to know facts via the testimony of those who don't believe what they are saying so long as their testimony is itself reliable, safe and sensitive (and we aren't "Gettierized"). Thus, it isn't a person's reliability as a believer that makes her testimony a source of knowledge, it's her reliability as a speaker. But Lackey also weighs in on a number of other interesting epistemological issues. For instance: she argues that testimony can actually create knowledge rather than merely transmit it; she attacks various accounts of the "constitutive norm" of assertion, taking aim at both the currently popular view that we should only assert what we know and an alternative account on which we need only assert what is true; and she sides with Reid against Hume in claiming that our warrant for accepting testimony cannot be reduced to an inference whose premises are known or justifiably believed on non-testimonial grounds, while nevertheless insisting against "anti-reductionists" that we need at least some positive reasons to justifiably believe the testimony of others.

Though many of Lackey's individual arguments are both novel and compelling, she somewhat overstates the degree to which they require a shift in focus from the minds of those involved in a testimonial exchange to their words. Surely, the mind of the hearer is an appropriate focal point, as good listeners will often fail to produce any words at all. And even though Lackey shows that speakers can provide us with knowledge that they do not have, she admits that to accomplish this feat they will probably have to satisfy other (often rather more rigorous) psychological conditions (p. 113, fn. 17). The book is therefore best conceptualized not as a sustained argument for the priority of words over minds in the philosophical investigation of testimony, but as a series of contributions to a number of on-going, somewhat independent epistemological debates. Still, the work's mischaracterization does not substantially detract from its worth, as Lackey writes in an exceedingly lucid fashion throughout, and motivates her more narrowly defined theses with interesting examples. Surely, analytic philosophers working on testimony have a professional obligation to read Lackey's work, if not to assess her provocative claim that they are all headed in the wrong direction, then to assimilate her valuable reflections on the issues with which they are concerned. But the book should also hold some interest for epistemologists thinking about related matters. There is, for instance, a nice appendix in which Lackey argues that memory -- like testimony -- can create, rather than just preserve, knowledge.

What is testimony? Perhaps the simplest view is that S testifies that p just in case S asserts that p. After effectively rebutting excessively rigorous views of testimony for failing to distinguish the genus testimony from the species good testimony, Lackey's first chapter attacks something like this naïve view. Actually, she calls the account she criticizes "BVNT," which is short for "the broad view of the nature of testimony," and one of the first snowflakes in a blizzard of acronyms to follow. (This is an entirely stylistic criticism, but the practice can be distracting. A representative sentence reads, "Now, RS-N and the SVT are the statement versions that parallel TEP-N and the BVT" (p. 75).) The BVNT is said to be "roughly" equivalent to the claim that "S testifies that p if and only if S's statement that p is an expression of S's thought that p" (p. 20).

Lackey's first argument against the BVNT is grounded in a passage from The Secret Garden in which Mary yells, "You can do it!" to toddler Colin as he tries to stand for the first time. Lackey argues that, contrary to the naïve view of the nature of testimony, Mary has not testified that Colin can walk because Mary hasn't attempted to convey information to Colin and Colin hasn't attempted to acquire information from Mary. But this description of the case is exceedingly unattractive. Mary might have encouraged Colin with an act of pure cheerleading by exclaiming, "Go! Go! Go!" or "Walk you little bugger!" But she did not. Instead, she encouraged Colin to walk by telling him that he can walk. (Indeed, we must describe Mary's act in this way if the case is to remain one in which she asserts that Colin can walk). Presumably, then, Mary intends to encourage Colin to walk by informing him that, despite his previously unsuccessful attempts, he does indeed have the ability to move about on his own two feet. Of course, Mary's primary intention in saying what she does is to get Colin to walk, but this is compatible with her possessing a secondary (instrumental) intention to convey information to Colin that she thinks will help accomplish this end.

If the naïve view is correct, the nature of testimony (and testimonial knowledge) is conceptually tied to the nature of assertion, and this is one area in which Lackey's book is disappointingly sparse. So, for instance, Lackey completes her argument against the naïve view by claiming that it is incompatible with people: (a) supplying testimony via head-nods and other non-verbal means, and (b) testifying to the obvious implications of those things they explicitly assert. But one might begin a response to (a) by insisting that the gestures that make up a sign language are instruments of assertion. If they are, why cannot non-verbal acts that are conventionally associated with certain propositions by the speaking public have an equivalent communicative function? With regard to (b), the defender of a naïve account of testimony might claim that if hearer H's knowledge that p is grounded in nothing more than S's testimony, then S must have asserted that p, whereas if q≠p is an implication or implicature of p -- even an obvious one -- any knowledge that q that H derives from S's assertion that p will be grounded in a combination of testimony and inference.

Of course, complications arise when the naïve theorist tries to distinguish what someone has asserted from what she has merely implied, conveyed or implicated in Gricean fashion. And because any reasonable account of assertion will allow that trusting listeners often accept much more than what is explicitly asserted, to avoid skepticism the naïve theorist will have to either invoke a slew of unconscious inferences on the part of hearers or argue that the justification or warrant for many of their testimonial beliefs can be properly characterized as inferential even though inferences play no role in their creation and maintenance. (Perhaps the inference need only be "available" in some attenuated sense.) But if Lackey is skeptical about both of these (rather traditional) epistemological moves, she should say why; instead, she simply states her "suspicion" that "the boundary" between "knowledge that is testimonial and that which is inferential" is "ultimately quite vague" (p. 30; fn. 27). On the way to a positive proposal, Lackey claims that the failure of the naïve view, when wedded to the problems faced by its more rigorous competitors, forces us to adopt a "disjunctivist" account of the phenomenon -- an account that bifurcates testimony into speaker-relative and hearer-relative varieties. When a speaker (or signaler) performs some act intending to communicate that p in virtue of the content of her act of communication, she will have therein speaker testified that p (p. 30). In contrast, S will have hearer testified that p by performing some act of communication that a hearer reasonably construes as intending to communicate that p in virtue of its content (p. 32). In response I can only report that thinking of testimony (simpliciter) as the disjunction of hearer and speaker testimony does not strike me as a particularly useful way to conceive of the phenomenon. It certainly does not have utility sufficient to compensate for its extraordinary inelegance.

There are some other passages in Learning from Words that would have benefited from a greater fidelity to our ordinary ways of categorizing and conceptualizing things. For instance, to argue against reductionist accounts of testimony, Lackey discusses Fred, a man who believes an otherwise reliable speaker Helen when she sincerely but incorrectly informs him that her friend Lucy is a trustworthy expert on birds. According to Lackey, Fred is not justified in accepting Lucy's claim that albatrosses have the largest wingspans among wild birds even though he has substantive positive reasons to believe this and no available defeating evidence. Not justified? Surely we wouldn't say that Fred was unjustified. In response, Lackey claims that she is using "justified" as synonymous with "warranted," while understanding both terms in such a way that warranted/justified beliefs must be highly truth-conducive (pp. 150-1, fn. 11). But this departure from ordinary usage is unhelpful. What we need here is a description -- and then perhaps an evaluation -- of the criticisms we would actually employ in assessing Fred's beliefs. He shouldn't believe what he does because it isn't true, but he's wrong on the wingspan issue through no fault of his own. Given Helen's excellent recommendation we would have trusted Lucy too, and all but the bird experts among us would have fallen for her line of bull. What is added by saying that Fred's belief is unwarranted in some technical sense of the word? When Lackey concludes the argument by stating,

It is not enough for testimonial justification or warrant that a hearer have even epistemically excellent positive reasons for accepting a speaker's testimony -- the speaker must also do her part in the testimonial exchange by offering testimony that is reliable or otherwise truth-conducive

one cannot help but think that this has not been shown to be true if Lackey is using "warrant" and "justification" in their ordinary senses, but question-beggingly established if she is stipulating that "warrant" and "justification" can only be applied to beliefs that are reliably formed. Though even with the stipulation in place, the reliabilist's generality problem rears its ugly head here. Why should we think that Fred's belief is grounded in the highly unreliable process or method denoted by "trust what Lucy says about birds" rather than the highly reliable process or method denoted by "trust the testimony of people in those areas in which Helen says they are experts"?

Lackey's claim that knowledge can be acquired from the testimony of those who do not know the facts they have stated gives rise to some of the book's most successful and intriguing passages. To my mind, her most compelling discussion of the phenomenon asks us to consider a religious science teacher who takes Genesis' creation myth as the literal truth, but who regards herself as maintaining these beliefs by the grace of her religious faith in the face of an otherwise overwhelming body of counter-evidence. If the creationist instructs her students as to the Earth's real age and the true origin of the species because she is committed to keeping her religious beliefs out of the classroom, it is hard to deny that they will learn what she teaches them. And if they learn from her words rather than her mind, they will acquire knowledge via the testimony of someone who does not believe (much less justifiably believe or know) what she has asserted. Indeed, cases like this provide Lackey with her central argument against the claim that knowledge is the constitutive norm of assertion. The teacher ought to continue on in asserting the scientific facts and her assertion of them is "proper" even though she neither believes nor knows them (pp. 110-13).

But do examples like this one show that words should "matter more" to us than beliefs when we examine the nature of testimonial knowledge? Do they show, in Lackey's words, that "the process of communicating via testimony does not involve a speaker transmitting her belief to a hearer" and that "statements … [not beliefs] are the central bearers of epistemic significance" (p. 72)? I think not, in part because though Lackey is convincing in her (ch. 8) rejection of views that overemphasize the role of trust in testimony, she wrongly eliminates trust from the equation altogether. Consider, for instance, what would happen were the creationist's students to learn why she does not believe what she has taught them. Those who are concerned with the truth above all else won't be shaken. But those who have not yet been pressed into the Enlightenment mind-set will be curious as to how and why their teacher maintains belief in the Genesis myth despite what she knows to be compelling evidence against it. How does she manage to resist the pull of the evidence? And why does she think her life is so much better as a result of her prevailing in this struggle against reason? If the pragmatic considerations she provides in response are compelling, and Lackey is right that the creationist's frame of mind is not only possible, but not necessarily irrational (p. 116, fn. 25), why wouldn't many of her students come to share it? And if the creationist's students are rationally responsive to this sort of information about her state of mind, does this not suggest that their assumptions about her beliefs played some role in grounding their original testimony-based beliefs in the origin of our planet and species?

Many of Lackey's arguments that words matter more than minds trade on speakers who care more about (or are more sensitive to) the pragmatic effects of holding a belief than its truth, and speakers and hearers who care more about (or are more sensitive to) the truth of the speaker's testimony than the pragmatic effects of believing it. And if creatures of this kind populated our world, the reliability of testifiers qua speakers would be the proper focus of our investigations of the knowledge gleaned from testimony, while the reliability of testifiers qua believers would not matter at all. But in our world, the producers of testimony are all consumers of it, and the consumers are all producers. Creationists, romantics and mystics who value faith and poetic enchantment more than reason when forming, revising, and maintaining their beliefs tend to make the same calculations when speaking and listening. Modern thinkers who value reason over faith, inspiration and comfort make the opposite calculations, but tend to do so in an equally consistent fashion. Indeed, when inconsistencies are found, they more often than not cut against the grain that Lackey highlights. That is, it is much more common for people to concern themselves with the truth when acquiring and revising their beliefs, but to focus on wholly pragmatic matters when deciding what to say. The liars, flatterers, and schemers vastly outnumber those "selfless asserters" who conscientiously keep their unreliability to themselves, and epistemically responsible listeners are therefore rational to reject professions that do not reflect the views of those professing. Thus, while words might have mattered more than minds in the acquisition and study of testimonial knowledge, they actually don't.