Learning to Live Naturally: Stoic Ethics and its Modern Significance

Learning to Live Naturally

Christopher Gill, Learning to Live Naturally: Stoic Ethics and its Modern Significance, Oxford University Press, 2022, 365pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198866169.

Reviewed by John Sellars, Royal Holloway, University of London


In this book Christopher Gill offers a robust defence of Stoic ethics. He calls into question a number of common and stubbornly persistent misconceptions of Stoicism, and the account that emerges may strike some as unexpected, even provocative. Among other things, he argues that Stoicism has a lot to offer modern virtue ethics and that, in many respects, Stoic ethics is more coherent and cogent than Aristotle’s ethics. The book, while no doubt of interest to specialists in ancient philosophy, has much wider ambitions and aims to make a contribution to contemporary ethical debates. As such, it has the potential to be of interest to a wide philosophical audience.

The book divides into three parts. The first part (chapters 1–3) sets out the core ideas in Stoic ethics. The second part (chapters 4–5) examines Stoic accounts of ethical development. The third part (chapters 6–8) considers the role that Stoic ethics might play in contemporary ethical debates, within both academic discussions of virtue ethics and popular life guidance and self-help.

In the first part Gill sets out what he takes to be the core ideas in Stoic ethics. These are i) the claim that virtue and virtue alone is required for happiness (chapter 1), ii) the claim that, despite that, other things can nevertheless be preferred or dispreferred (chapter 2), and iii) the definition of the goal of life as to live in agreement with nature (chapter 3).

In the opening chapter, Gill introduces Stoic ethics against the background of earlier ancient ethics, arguing that it is more attractive than either the Platonic or Aristotelian alternatives. In particular, Gill argues that the Stoic claim that virtue alone is necessary and sufficient for happiness is more coherent than Aristotle’s slightly confused account which prioritizes virtue but also tries to hold on to some role for conventional goods as well (20, 62). This is built upon in the second chapter, which sets out how the Stoic theory of preferred and dispreferred ‘indifferents’ offers a better account of the role of conventional goods in a happy human life. On the Stoic view, things such as health, money, and social status are not genuine goods but are nevertheless preferred over their opposites, other things being equal. Here Gill argues against claims made by Rachel Barney and Tad Brennan that maximizing such preferred indifferents is a core part of the Stoic view (80–84). The third chapter considers the relationship between ethics and nature, especially in the light of the Stoic view that the goal of human life ought to be to live in agreement with nature. Gill argues that the key accounts of Stoic ethics rely primarily on ethical claims alone, without appeals to nature, even if nature is sometimes brought into the discussion in order to develop some claims further.

Throughout, Gill is strident in his defence of Stoicism from often-voiced criticisms. One view that he is particularly keen to challenge involves the claims that i) Stoic ethics is dependent on Stoic physics and ii) Stoic physics depends on a theory of providence, understood as a kind of naïve Panglossian ‘best of all possible worlds’ optimism. With regard to the first of these concerns, Gill argues that it would be a mistake to interpret claims about the interconnectedness of the Stoic system (logic, physics, ethics) as implying some kind of foundational relationship that makes ethics dependent on physics (121–32). There is no clear evidence in the ancient sources to justify any kind of hierarchy among the three parts of philosophy. Each has its own foundations, Gill argues, but is informed and enriched by the other parts. On the second claim, Gill argues that it is a mistake to think of Stoic providence in terms of what may (or may not) happen in the future, something about which we ultimately have no knowledge (141–2). Instead, we ought to think of it in terms of how well disposed nature has made us in order to enable us to flourish and live well. One way in which nature expresses its providential care for us is by making us well disposed towards ourselves and others. Humans are by nature social animals and, things going well, they take care of each other, especially close loved ones (31–3). On this reading, Stoic providence becomes a foundation for socially-minded ethical action rather than a fatal weakness of the whole position.

The second part of the book moves on to consider Stoic accounts of ethical development. It focuses on the Stoic theory of appropriation (chapter 4) and their account of emotions (chapter 5).

The theory of appropriation (oikeiôsis) plays a key role in Stoic ethics and is a central theme throughout Gill’s account. It offers a clear statement, Gill argues, of the social dimension of Stoic thought. The theory states that all animals, including humans, are by nature concerned with their own wellbeing and that of their offspring. Parental love for children is a widely observable natural instinct and, as such, offers a foundation for thinking about interpersonal relationships (167–8). This also helps to challenge a commonly held view that the Stoics advocated emotional detachment from other people. Here Gill has in mind concerns raised by Martha Nussbaum and Richard Sorabji. In response, he argues that the Stoic goal is not complete apatheia but the cultivation of eupatheiai, good emotions, in place of irrational psychological disturbances such as fear and anger. In this context, Gill tackles an infamous passage in Epictetus which seems to say that one ought to respond to the death of a child no differently to how one would respond to the breaking of a favourite jug (Enchiridion 3). Gill reads this in the light of a longer version in Discourses 3.24, arguing that the aim of the longer passage as a whole is to acknowledge the impermanence of all things without diluting any sense of affection for loved ones (237–46). Another passage, in Discourses 4.1, suggests that when training oneself to cope with impermanence, one ought to begin with trivial items, like a favourite jug, and slowly work up to more traumatic losses, such as a loved one. The highly compressed version in Enchirdion 3, produced by Arrian, needs to be interpreted against these other passages, Gill suggests.

In the third and final part of the book, Gill considers the ways in which Stoic ethics might be relevant today. His main focus here is on the contribution Stoicism might make to modern virtue ethics (chapter 6). However, he also considers how it might also contribute to debates in environmental ethics (chapter 7) and how it has been taken up in recent years by members of the general public looking for guidance in how to live (chapter 8).

As Gill notes, modern virtue ethics was inspired by Aristotle and, although other versions have developed since, Aristotle remains the central point of reference (250). And yet, Aristotle’s ethics contains a range of unresolved problems, ‘a number of loose ends, ambiguities and internal tensions or inconsistencies, on quite major points’ (255). By contrast, Stoic ethics ‘is more fully worked out, more systematic in conception and presentation and more consistent’ (255). As such, Gill argues that Stoic ethics ought to be far more attractive to modern virtue ethicists than Aristotle’s ethics, which has ‘serious limitations’ (267). One such problem is the tension between the images of the practical and contemplative lives in Aristotle’s Nicomachean Ethics, an issue that has attracted no end of scholarly commentary. Gill argues that the Stoics bypass this issue by affirming instead simply a rational life, referring to Diogenes Laertius’ report that a rational agent is ‘equipped by nature for theory and action’ (271, citing Diog. Laert. 7.130).

A further strength of Stoic ethics, Gill argues, is its concern with the place of humans within nature. The Stoics conceived nature as a single, unified, and self-sustaining system, of which humans are integrated parts (299–306). This offers a suggestive way to think about environmental ethics in the face of the current climate crisis. Not only that, Stoicism integrates this environmental thinking into its virtue ethics in a way that Aristotelian and other versions do not. The Stoics accord humans a special place within nature as rational agents, but rather than see this as disconnecting humans from the rest of nature, Gill argues that it gives humans, as privileged rational beings, ‘a special role in promoting the welfare and flourishing of other forms of life’ and the stability of the ecosystem as a whole (305).

In the final chapter, Gill turns to consider the popular interest in Stoicism that has flourished in recent years. He comments on the work that he (and, for full disclosure, I) have done presenting Stoic ideas to a wide audience through ‘Stoic Week’ and other activities. Against detractors who have been sceptical about the supposed benefits of following Stoic advice, Gill outlines the very positive responses people have had to encountering Stoic ideas, its influence on cognitive psychotherapy, and the first controlled studies testing the efficacy of Stoic ideas for treating psychological problems. All this gives ‘strong support’ to Gill’s central thesis that Stoicism offers a ‘powerful and coherent’ guide to living an ethical and happy life (333).

Inevitably, I have had to pass over a lot of details in this short review. The book includes a number of close readings of key ancient sources and a good deal of discussion of modern virtue ethics. Gill situates his interpretations in relation to the best known pieces of existing scholarship. The works of Julia Annas and Daniel Russell are frequent points of reference and readers familiar with their work will have a good sense of what to expect here.

I am very sympathetic to the overall picture that Gill paints. His defence of the social dimension of Stoic ethics is a valuable corrective to a common trend in both academic and popular discussions that tend to present Stoicism as individualistic and isolationist. This common misconception may in part be the product of an overreliance on Epictetus as a source of information for Stoicism, especially in popular accounts. It is Epictetus who says that all one controls are one’s judgements and everything else is simply ‘out of one’s control’; as we have seen, it is also he who supposedly suggests that losing a loved one is little different from breaking a favourite jug. Yet, in some respects, Epictetus is an atypical Stoic: he downplays the distinction between preferred and dispreferred indifferents, drifting quite close towards Cynicism. Gill’s account, by contrast, is based primarily on the accounts of Stoic ethics that we find much earlier in Cicero, especially in De finibus and De officiis, even if he takes into account a good range of other evidence. There are, I think, good reasons to take Cicero’s accounts as one’s point of departure: they are detailed compared to other accounts, they explain the reasoning behind the views, and they are the earliest extended accounts to survive. As Gill’s book shows, an account of Stoic ethics that begins with Cicero leads to a quite different picture from one that is over-dependent on Epictetus.

There is one matter where I might take issue with Gill. In his account of preferred and dispreferred indifferents, Gill says that these have ‘intrinsic’ or ‘inherent’ value (55, 57). I would suggest that their value is not intrinsic to them but instead dependent on the extent to which they contribute to an individual’s self-preservation. This is why they are sometimes categorized as either according or contrary to nature. Gill also expresses this by saying that they have ‘objective’ value (57, 58, 61). That arsenic will poison me is objective in the sense that it is a fact about the natural world, but that it does so is not intrinsic to the arsenic. It is a consequence of my constitution and what the arsenic does to me, and so in this sense is relative to me; other beings may not be so affected. However, a little later, Gill acknowledges that preferred indifferents do not always benefit people (60). This may be seen as a fairly minor point and perhaps simply a matter of expression, but it seems central to Gill’s project, which is to show that Stoic ethics offers a more coherent and plausible foundation for modern virtue ethics than the Aristotelian alternative. Part of the argument against Aristotelian ethics is the claim that there is a lack of clarity about the relationship between virtue and external goods. The Stoics, by contrast, are clear and emphatic that virtue, and virtue alone, is the necessary and sufficient condition for happiness. The clarity of the Stoic view, then, depends on their account of preferred and dispreferred indifferents not being inherently good. Later on in his discussion, Gill seems to acknowledge this, stating that the preferability or dispreferability of external goods must be assessed in each specific situation, according to what will contribute to the best course of action (67). Their value, then, is relational, not intrinsic.

Overall, this book offers a strident defence of Stoic ethics against both academic and popular detractors. It insists on the social dimension within Stoicism and argues that Stoic ethics is community minded and environmentally aware. Stoic ethics is a more coherent and plausible model for modern virtue ethics than Aristotle’s ethics and it has already proven itself to be attractive to large numbers of the general public. In both theory and practice, Stoicism has plenty to offer.