Lectures on Anthropology

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Immanuel Kant, Lectures on Anthropology, Allen W. Wood and Robert B. Louden (trs.), Cambridge University Press, 2012, 627pp., $150.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521771610.

Reviewed by Thomas Sturm, Autonomous University of Barcelona


Translating Kant is not exactly a piece of cake. This English edition of his lectures on anthropology, edited by Allen Wood and Robert Louden, both leading experts in the fields of Kant's anthropology and the translation of his works, is a fine accomplishment. I highly recommend it. This is so despite several (mostly minor) problems, some of which I will indicate.

According to many reports, Kant was a successful university teacher.[1] He attracted numerous students, and his style of lecturing was free, lively, even witty. In two courses that he taught over a number of years, a wider public audience was permitted: anthropology and physical geography (these being called, somewhat misleadingly, his "popular" lectures). Kant taught on anthropology every winter semester from 1772/73 up until 1795/96. Only after he had finished doing so did he publish a related textbook, the Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of View (1798). Before that, students had taken notes of the course -- probably through some organized division of labor (p. 5), partly for the purpose of having the notes at their disposal, partly for the purpose of selling them. Yes, there was a market for this; for instance, people in Berlin asked for these students' notes. The lecture manuscripts, though not written by Kant himself, contain pretty reliable information about what he taught. We know that from, among other things, the number and reliability of the available manuscripts, and from comparison of them with his published works, his letters, and his Reflexionen. Lecture notes from other courses (say, on logic or moral philosophy) have not always been edited well -- partly due to historical contingencies having to do with World War II and the division of Germany after that. Several parts of the official Academy edition of Kant's gesammelte Schriften need revision. That's another story (Sturm, 1999; Brandt & Stark, 2000; Gloyna, Karl & Stark, 2008). Moral: Don't use the lecture notes blindly without informing yourself about their status, reliability, dating, and development.

But the present English edition of Kant's lectures on anthropology is based on vol. XXV of the Academy edition,[2] edited by Reinhard Brandt and Werner Stark in 1997. Here, the Academy edition leaves nothing much to be desired. It contains 7 manuscripts from over the years. (More than forty such texts are known, at least by name; 20 of them are electronically available.[3] It would have been too laborious and expensive to publish all of them in vol. XXV, which already has more than 1,600 pages.) These manuscripts make us understand better not only Kant's views about the facts of human mind, society, and history, but also their relation to his epistemology, ethics, and aesthetics. For instance, the lectures show that he was far from being naïve about human reason and its efficacy concerning morals. Vol. XXV contains an extensive introduction (Brandt & Stark, 1997), explaining the nature and dating of all manuscripts, the institutional background of the lectures, the education of the students who wrote the manuscripts, and so on. The manuscripts themselves contain an extensive critical apparatus concerning variant readings and references to numerous publications from science, literature, and philosophy that Kant (often obliquely) made. No surprise that vol. XXV has inspired a new body of scholarship (e.g. Brandt, 1999; Frierson, 2003; Jacobs & Kain, 2003; Louden, 2000, 2011; Schmidt, 2005, 2007; Sturm, 2009; Wilson, 2006). The philological and historical quality of the German edition shines through the English one as well.

The Cambridge edition is not a complete translation of vol. XXV. It contains two fully translated manuscripts, namely Friedländer (from 1775-76; translated by Gisela Felicitas Munzel) and Mrongovius (1784-85; translated by Robert C. Clewis). In addition, there are excerpts from Collins and Parow (both 1772-73, translated by Wood), Pillau (1777-78, translated by Wood), Menschenkunde (probably 1781-82, translated by Louden), and Busolt (1788-89, translated by Wood). As in vol. XXV, the 1790s are not represented. One might have considered a translation of Matuszewski (1791/92; printed in Kowalewski & Stark, 2000), which is very rich in content and reads more fluently than many other lecture notes. However, it poses the problem that it is probably a compilation of contents from several years, and disentangling those is difficult. Another option might have been Naumburg (1790-91, which will also become available from the Marburg Kant webpage). Naumburg was discovered only shortly after the German edition was published. Unlike the temporally close Busolt, which unfortunately breaks off shortly after the beginning of Part II of the course, the so-called "Anthropological Characteristics", Naumburg is complete.[4] But perhaps it is better not to have taken over the task of translating Naumburg without a critical German edition of this manuscript. Nonetheless, Kant scholars should be aware of both texts. If used cautiously and critically, they might help in the interpretation of Kant's thought and its development.

Wood's succinct general introduction, as well as the critical apparatus and footnotes to the manuscripts, are not translations of vol. XXV. The footnotes and the critical apparatus often follow vol. XXV, but sometimes present additional information (e.g., the interesting note 7 on p. 528 concerning optical instruments), and sometimes leave out relevant points. For instance, in Pillau the passage "the human being is the sole freely acting being on the earth's surface" (p. 261) is based on a conjecture by Brandt and Stark, not mentioned by the translator. The manuscript actually speaks of the human being as the witzige bey handelnden Wesen (roughly, "the witty/jocular among acting beings"; AA XXV, p. 733, fn. 2). Brandt and Stark have turned this, plausibly, into the einzige frey handelnde Wesen, which fits with conceptual points of Kant's concerning his anthropology. But it is a conjecture.

An extensive and highly useful glossary, as well as a short bibliography on works dealing with Kant's anthropology close the volume. It is commendable that the editors do not confine themselves to English and German scholarship, but also point to works in French, Italian, and Spanish. Also, when going through the glossary, I found myself almost entirely in agreement with the translators, with one somewhat important exception (see below).

The editors do not tell us why they chose to translate Friedländer and Mrongovius completely instead of others, or why in the case of the other manuscripts they selected some fragments rather than others. Still, my impression is that their choices have been quite reasonable. Friedländer and Mrongovius stem from the mid-1770s on the one side, when Kant was working mostly silently (i.e., without publishing much) on the project of critical philosophy, and from the mid-1780s, when several of his major works had either appeared or were in the making. Hence, these manuscripts can make the reader aware of certain changes in Kant's anthropological thought and its relation to his other works. Concerning the selected fragments the editors chose, rightly in my view, to always translate the introductions. These reflect changes in Kant's understanding of what his anthropology was all about -- how he determined its methods, its goals, and its very subject-matter. For instance, in the first course, represented by Collins and Parow, Kant's declared programmatic aim was to turn this discipline into an autonomous science, primarily by distinguishing it sharply from metaphysics. At the same time, he used the terms 'anthropology' (Anthropologie or Wissenschaft vom Menschen) and 'empirical psychology' (empirische Psychologie), interchangeably.

That began to change around the mid-1770s. In Friedländer, Kant announced that his anthropology or Wissenschaft vom Menschen should be a "pragmatic" discipline, or "knowledge of the world". He spoke less of it as a "psychology" and by the 1790s explicitly rejected the identification (see the letter to his former student Marcus Herz of 1778, AA X 242; Critique of Pure Reason, A849/B877;Reflexion 1502a in AA XV, p. 800f., ca. 1790/91; anthropology manuscript Reichel (1793/94), p. 9 -- also an interesting manuscript, but of it even AA vol. XXV contains only very few passages).[5] These were ideas he came to develop further and further. Ultimately, the qualification of his anthropology as "pragmatic" became, among other things, a determination of both the goal and the subject matter of the discipline. It should be useful for the human social world, but it should also simply be about the social world, or the rules of human social conduct. The editors do not note the latter point, but it is important. The knowledge of human society that is possible for us places a constraint upon what kind of useful directions Kantian anthropology can provide. In particular, the editors (p. 4) suggest the view, held by many other interpreters as well, that Kant connects the terms 'pragmatic knowledge' or 'doctrine of prudence' (Klugheitslehre), and that therefore his anthropology would be directed at promoting individual human happiness. However, because he also frequently notes that 'happiness' is an idea lacking in clear content, we cannot really know much about how to achieve happiness, neither from philosophy nor from empirical science (AA IV, pp. 395f., 399, VI, p. 388, VII pp. 130, 234f).

The lectures, especially in their more developed form, consisted of two main parts. I am unsure what the editors mean when they say (p. 1), that Kant had difficulties in giving the lectures "any systematic form". Indeed, it is true that he changed his mind about what that form should be, but he certainly intended to develop "the systematic -- and if I may say -- architectonic shape and order of what constitutes a science", as he wrote in the letter to Herz just mentioned (AA X, p. 242). And indeed, it is not easy to rationally reconstruct that form, but that is true for all of Kant's works. As was required at the time, he had to use a textbook for the lectures, and he chose the chapter on Psychologia Empirica from Alexander Baumgarten's Metaphysica (1739, 4th ed. 1757). He not only deviated from its details but also from its structure. Part I of the anthropology lectures was built on the basis of a threefold division of basic mental faculties -- cognition, feeling, and desire. We should not understand this as a mere assemblage of separate topics. All three basic faculties are, in Kant's view at least, necessarily related to one another in the explanation of any action -- and action (in the social sphere), can be said to be the explanans of his anthropology. Only by understanding what drives human action can we understand how the social world works, and how we can successfully deal with other human beings in that world -- hence, only with such a framework can an anthropology be "pragmatic".

After the mid-1770s Kant increasingly separated a Part II of the lectures, the "Anthropological Characteristics". This was the most substantial departure from Baumgarten; none of this existed in the latter's empirical psychology. The "Anthropological Characteristics" is also represented in the five chosen fragments in Wood and Louden's edition, at least the conceptual remarks at the beginning of that section.[6] Again, this is a wise choice, since the creation of Part II is perhaps the most novel and substantial development of the lectures. It is not easy to tell what was on Kant's mind, though. It is only beyond reasonable doubt that he did not use the term 'character' to refer to another mental faculty, let alone a basic faculty like cognition, feeling, and desire. Also, Part II was supposed to be an application of Part I. But what kind of application? Kant answered in different ways over the years: for instance, at times he described the "Characteristics" as a differential study of specific classes of human beings (in contrast to the "general knowledge" of the human being contained in Part I), then as a "practical" kind of Menschenkenntnis (as opposed to the "theoretical" Part I), in the sense that it would tell how "human beings are constituted in their voluntary actions" (from Mrongovius, here p. 465); finally, he also described Part II as a "doctrine of method" (Part I: "doctrine of elements"). These distinctions are not identical, and none of them is satisfactory. Nor is what Kant says in the finally published Anthropology any better (for more on these complications, see Sturm, 2009, pp. 404-409).

This is so because Kant, starting with the lecture of 1777/78 (Pillau[7]), began to draw a sharp distinction between two kinds of character -- new not only in his own works, but perhaps in the history of the concepts of character: one the one side, character as "mode of sense" ("Sinnesart"), one the other side, character as "mode of thought" ("Denkungsart"). In this edition, the distinction is translated as "conduct of sensibility/sensibilities"and as "conduct of thought/way of thinking", respectively (based perhaps on Munzel, 1999, pp. xv-xvi). That is the translation that I found inadequate. These English terms are hard to understand for a native German speaker: phrases such as "Verhalten nach Sinnlichkeit(en)" and "Verhalten nach Denken" do not exist in German, and do not make much sense anyway. Only "way of thinking" has a German equivalent ("Denkweise"). However, what is more important is that there is an interesting ambiguity in the German expression -art in such composite terms.

(1) It can point to a species or type of something, including types of actions. Consider "Sportart" as a generic term for kinds of sports (say, table tennis, synchronized swimming, or axe throwing); similarly "Tierart" (duck, rabbit, . . . ), or "Rechenart" (multiplication, division, . . . ). The language of character or personality traits may in part be viewed the same way: "He is a liar/bore/idiot . . . ", "she is honest", and so on. That is the traditional, differential concept of character, shared by Aristotle, Theophrastus, Hume, and current differential psychology.

(2) But -art can also, at least sometimes, be used to refer to a way in which an action of a certain type is performed. We speak of different ways of playing chess, and we do not thereby mean different kinds of chess, but the style: one's "Spielart" (="Spielweise") can be aggressive or defensive, for instance. (I don't think "Rechenart" is similarly ambiguous.)

Kant's terms "Sinnesart" and "Denkungsart" hide the fact that -art has both of these meanings in ordinary German. Yet, something like the difference between (1) and (2) can be found when we consider what the two framing terms of the "Characteristics" mean. "Sinnesart" is used to differentiate kinds or classes of human conduct, and all humans have some kind(s) of "Sinnesart" or other. We classify them according to which kind(s) of "Sinnesart" they have -- whether they are obedient, humorous, lazy, or what else. The rules of "Sinnesart" are empirical rules that follow from our temperaments, or from habits due to upbringing and socialization, and they can be used to explain and predict actions. "Denkungsart", however, is something different. Its function is not to distinguish between types of behavior, at least not in the same way as "Sinnesart". It rather serves to indicate a way in which (some, not all) humans deal with their given "Sinnesart"-rules. "Denkungsart" refers to the way in which an agent follows certain rules of "Sinnesart": namely, consciously, after due rational deliberation, after having weighted them and put them into an order, after having rejected some of them and reformed others, all due to critical argument. Accordingly, while all human beings have a "Sinnesart", not all possess a "Denkungsart", though in Kant's view they could and should. Perhaps the English translation should somehow keep this ambiguity, using, e.g., "mode of thought" and "mode of sense" respectively ('mode', being translated as both Art and Weise in the dictionaries that I use, seems equally ambiguous as -- art), adding an explanatory footnote. Or perhaps the ambiguity should be dissolved by using different expressions throughout, say "way of thinking" for "Denkungsart" versus something like "type of disposition" for "Sinnesart".[8] But because the terms are so central for Kant's ripe anthropology, the issue should be made clear to the reader.

In any case, Kant's "Anthropological Characteristics" does have a dual task: not merely to differentiate between types of human conduct, but also to outline a theoretical framework for an empirical account of rational or self-directed action. Sometimes Kant even indicates that it is only by this latter aspect that his anthropology studies the human being as a free agent, that is, not merely a natural being. It is quite problematic how to understand this idea, given Kant's views about freedom and nature. But it is plausible to think that this is what is on his mind when he says that a pragmatic anthropology does not only represent "knowledge of the world" in the sense of "knowing the world" ("die Welt kennen") but also "having a world" ("Welt haben") (Anthropology from a Pragmatic Point of ViewAA VII, p. 120). The editors (p. 3) rightfully point to this distinction. It can be explained, I think, against the background of the "Sinnesart"/"Denkungsart" distinction: if you develop a "Denkungsart", you start engaging in social life in the sense of shaping its rules yourself. Kant thinks that human historical development ultimately involves agents who shape their own destiny, and the mechanism by which they do it is by inventing new rules of engagement, new societal institutions. The Kantian anthropologist -- if there were such a type of scientist -- views research subjects as they view themselves, namely as active players of the game called human society. Read the lectures if you want to know the details.[9]


Brandt, R. (1999): Kritischer Kommentar zu Kants 'Anthropologie in pragmatischer Hinsicht'. Hamburg.

Brandt, R. and Stark, W. (1997): Einleitung. In: Kants Gesammelte Schriften (Academy edition), Vol. XXV. Göttingen, vii-cli.

Brandt, R. and Stark, W. (eds.) (2000): Zustand und Zukunft der Akademie-Ausgabe von Immanuel Kants Gesammelten Schriften. Berlin.

Frierson, P. (2003): Freedom and Anthropology in Kant's Moral Philosophy. Cambridge/England.

Gloyna, T., Karl, J. & Stark, W. (2008): Kant's gesammelte Schriften im Jahr 2008. Studi Kantiani, 21, 99-107.

Jacobs, B. & Kain, P. (eds.) (2003): Essays on Kant's Anthropology. Cambridge/England.

Kowalewski, S. & Stark, W. (2000): Königsberger Kantiana: Immanuel Kant, Werke, Volksausgabe, Bd. 1, hg. von Arnold Kowalewski. Hamburg.

Louden, R. B. (2000): Kant's Impure Ethics. New York.

Louden, R. B. (2011). Kant's Human Being: Essays on His Theory of Human Nature. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Munzel, G. 1999. Kant's Conception of Moral Character: The "Critical"Link of Morality, Anthropology, and Reflective Judgment. Chicago: Chicago University Press.

Schmidt, C. M. (2005): "The Anthropological Dimension of Kant's Metaphysics of Morals." Kant-Studien 96, 66-84.

Schmidt, C. M. (2007): "Kant's Transcendental, Empirical, Pragmatic, and Moral Anthropology." Kant-Studien 98, 156-182.

Sturm, T. (1999): "Zustand und Zukunft der Akademie-Ausgabe von Immanuel Kants Gesammelten Schriften." Kant-Studien 90, 100-106.

Sturm, T (2009): Kant und die Wissenschaften vom Menschen. Paderborn: Mentis.

Wilson, H. (2006): Kant's Pragmatic Anthropology: Its Origin, Meaning, and Critical Significance. Albany, NY.

[1] For clear and comprehensive information about Kant in the classroom, see the webpage by Steve Naragon.

[2] Cited herafter as AA, with volume (Roman numerals) and page numbers.

[3] Strictly speaking, they have been available from the Kant Information Online webpage at Marburg University. The webpage is currently under reconstruction.

[4] Many thanks also to Werner Stark for several pointers and comments concerning these two manuscripts.

[5] I thus disagree with the claim that Ernst Platner’s Anthropologie für Ärzte und Weltweise (1772) “was the avowed occasion for Kant to begin lecturing on anthropology”, a kind of early neuropsychology, (p. 526, footnote 5). Kant indeed wished to distance himself from such a “physiological” anthropology. But there is no evidence that Kant’s decision to start his course was due to his reception of Platner’s work. In the 1772/73 course, there is no statement yet of (i) an opposition to a “physiological” anthropology, nor (ii) that the proper alternative would be a “pragmatic” anthropology. The earliest evidence for (i) is contained in a letter to Marcus Herz from the end of 1773 (AA X, p. 145). (ii) is made clear first in Friedländer.

[6] The fragments also contain other section from the lectures, especially the chapters dealing with feelings and related aesthetic issues.

[7] Curiously, the editors do not summarize this manuscript in their otherwise useful overview of the seven sets of student notes (Introduction, pp. 7-8).

[8] Thanks to Wolfgang Carl, Sven Rosenkranz, and Jens Timmermann for feedback concerning this point.

[9] Completion of this review was supported by the Spanish Ministry for Science and Innovation, through research award FFI 2008-01559/FISO