Lectures on Consciousness and Interpretation

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J. N. Mohanty, Lectures on Consciousness and Interpretation, Tara Chatterjea (ed.), Oxford UP, 2009, 177pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780195698510.

Reviewed by Lilian Alweiss, Trinity College, Dublin



Undoubtedly, J. N. Mohanty stands out as an eminent authority on Husserl. His writings, notably on the relation between Husserl and Frege and on Husserl’s theory of meaning, have become seminal texts. Mohanty is best known for his work on phenomenology; however, he has also worked extensively on Indian Buddhist philosophy, trying to point to possible connections between East and West. In many ways, the Lectures on Consciousness and Interpretation sum up Mohanty’s work. This slim book is a compilation of lectures and essays comprising topics on consciousness, time, quantum physics, relativism and idealism, to name but a few, each drawing on phenomenology and Indian Buddhist philosophy.

The main thread linking these lectures is the claim that phenomenology and the Indian tradition of Buddhism represented in such systems as Vedānta assign a place of pre-eminence to consciousness. (cf. 38) Mohanty thereby seeks to overturn a certain prejudice that has been dominating Western philosophy, namely, the belief that the term consciousness is an essentially Western concept. We find such prejudice, for example, exemplified in Heidegger’s claim that the concept of consciousness has its historical roots in Western metaphysics. (44) Mohanty, however, shows how both traditions can be assimilated. It is not at all problematic to translate the Sanskrit word ‘cit’ as ‘consciousness’. (43) Both traditions believe that one cannot naturalise consciousness: it is impossible to think the absence of consciousness, as thinking is a modality of consciousness. ‘To doubt or deny that consciousness exists is analogous to doubting or denying that I am’ (39).

This claim may sound essentially Cartesian, yet Mohanty insists that consciousness here should not be confused with a soul or with a substance that is distinct from the body or world. On the contrary, when we look at the structure of consciousness, a unitary worldview emerges: there is a necessary correlation between consciousness and the world; neither can exist independent of the other. Thus, what phenomenology and Vedāntic philosophy understand by consciousness is very different from the Cartesian view. Consciousness is necessarily reflective (and thus transcendental); it is intentional and, moreover, embodied. It is reflective insofar as there can be no thought without an awareness that we are thinking about something. It is intentional because to think means to think of something. It is material insofar as consciousness, ‘even as transcendental contains sensory contents’ (36), a point exemplified in Husserl’s treatment of the lived body and the Buddhist emphasis on the sensory system. So, our initial understanding is that there is much in common between Buddhist philosophy and phenomenology.

Mohanty realises that if we are to accept that there is a necessary correlation between consciousness and the world, then we need to ask what kind of knowledge is actually possible. One of Mohanty’s concerns is to fend off charges of relativism and historicism, which are often levelled against phenomenology. By providing a central role to consciousness, Mohanty accepts the transcendental idealist claim that objects only constitute themselves in relation to consciousness. This implies not only that knowledge is relative to my perspective but, as Husserl’s discussion of the lifeworld demonstrates, that it is also relative to our cultural practices. The charge of relativism is misplaced, according to Mohanty, not because we can appeal to an objectivity that can be imposed onto the plurality of our worldviews, but because objectivity emerges from within. By drawing on Donald Davidson’s claim that relativism is an incoherent position, he argues that I am only able to refer to alternative conceptual schemes if I can translate other schemes into mine or vice versa. This requires both a shared understanding and an ability to divorce myself from my point of view. Mohanty argues that the ensuing objectivity is fragile. It cannot be achieved by a

violent act by which one validity claim imperiously supersedes all others but shall rather consist in that gentle and tolerant view which recognizes that unity is always the process of being achieved by communication and is just too fragile to be sustained by any violence (91).

The shared world remains an ideal in need of constant negotiation. This leads Mohanty to conclude that objectivity ‘is being worked out rather than being a pre-existent metaphysical entity’. This is what Mohanty means when he says that objectivity cannot be imposed from without, but can only emerge from within. In his lights, Husserlian idealism thus merely questions the possibility of adopting a view from ‘nowhere,’ but does not pave the way to relativism or subjectivism.

Mohanty develops this view in his essay on ‘Idealism and Quantum Mechanics’. Here Mohanty demonstrates the manner in which phenomenology can have a bearing on science by discussing the Copenhagen interpretation of quantum mechanics. The aim is not to defend this interpretation, but to discuss the status and nature of idealism. Mohanty seeks to show that those who criticise or, for that matter, defend the Copenhagen interpretation for being idealistic and subjective are operating with an impoverished notion of subjectivity and confuse the charge of idealism with solipsism. Yet once we adopt a richer conception of subjectivity, as developed by Husserl and Hegel, we realise that such a reading is misplaced. Mohanty finds this is exemplified in Carl Friedrich von Weizsäcker’s writings on quantum mechanics. According to Weizsäcker, quantum mechanics ‘overcomes’ (understood in a Heideggerian way) the subject-object dualism since the object that is studied is no longer regarded as divorced from the observer, but constitutes itself in relation to the scientist’s practices. To this extent, quantum mechanics adopts Kant’s insight that ‘the conditions of the possibility of experience are at the same time the conditions of the possibility of objects of experience’ (102). Weizsäcker sees this position reflected in modern physics, where ‘Not the isolated thing, but only the whole of the relation man-thing is valid … as an intelligible reality’ (109). Although Weizsäcker appeals to Heidegger’s work, Mohanty shows that ‘Husserlian phenomenology, which discovers subjective performances underlying all objective structures, provides us with a conceptual apparatus suited to comprehend the new situation’ (111).

This could lead us to conclude that what holds true for phenomenology also holds for Vendātic philosophy, since it equally overcomes the subject-object dualism. Yet, curiously, Mohanty does not draw this conclusion. He is keen to show that Vedāntin’s non-dual consciousness is distinct from Husserlian consciousness. This appears to contradict what Mohanty tried to emphasise throughout the book, namely, that the Vedāntic notion of non-dual consciousness has much in common with Husserl’s account of internal time consciousness. As we have shown, both are meant to be intentional, temporal, and reflexive, and we are even told that Vedāntin’s account of the standing, streaming, unchanging awareness is similar to the Heraclitean flux of absolute consciousness in Husserl (122). Yet in this text we learn that Vedāntic pure undifferentiated consciousness (the non-dual cit) is anterior to Husserl’s notion of living presence and the most inner dimension of Husserl’s account of internal time consciousness (116). So, while ‘an idealistic theory of science … needs a theory of consciousness according to which consciousness is intentional, constituting, temporal and historical’ (114), we are told that this should not be confused with Vedāntic non-dual consciousness since ‘the pure consciousness of non-dualistic Vedānta does not possess a causal power’ (114).

Here I am at a loss. On the one hand, we are told that we can draw analogies between the Husserlian and Vedāntic consciousness; on the other hand, we are informed that they are clearly distinct. What Mohanty only touches on in passing may point to strong metaphysical disagreements which could lead us to side with the view that the Vedāntic notion of consciousness is, after all, quite distinct from the Western (Husserlian) conception. While Mohanty does not expand on this, he seems to suggest that Vedāntic non-dual consciouness is the only ‘thing’ or better ‘realm’ that is properly speaking real. The reader is told that according to the Vedāntic view, ‘the phenomenal world is an appearance but not a real product or creation’ (113) (since consciousness does not create). Yet this means that ‘the phenomenal world is … “indescribable as being either existent or non-existent” and as being, in that sense false’ (113).

If I have understood these claims correctly (they have not been developed in the book), then, according to Vedāntic philosophy, we can only refer to the world of appearances (which is nothing other than fiction or just false) and never to the world as it is in itself. This is a reading Tara Chatterjea, the editor of the book, adopts. She claims that Mohanty is ‘not talking about reality’ (6) and indeed that he argues that ‘access to reality as it is in itself is not possible [since] description is always that of the interpreted data (8)’. In view of this, it is not difficult to argue that ‘the past and the present have to be acknowledged as products of imagination and interpretation’ (12). Such claims may make sense from a Buddhist perspective, but they certainly do not reflect the phenomenological one. Although intentional acts are meaning conferring, and even though interpretation is an essential tool of phenomenology, Mohanty warns us not to return to the metaphysically suspicious claim that ‘when one achieves genuine cognitive access to the object, one no longer needs to interpret, and that as long as one is interpreting, one does not know the object’ (155). For Husserl, nothing is more real than the world as it manifests itself. Interpretation does not distort the object, but makes the object visible.

I thus doubt whether Mohanty would agree with the editor’s interpretation. However, the problem is that Mohanty does not discuss the status of Vedāntic philosophy, and Chatterjea’s misunderstanding may well point to a significant divergence between Vedāntic philosophy and phenomenology. Nowhere does Mohanty provide a proper argument or analysis to guide the reader one way or another. We are merely given to understand that both use the same concepts and have the same thoughts; but as these are taken out of context, they are difficult to understand. Maybe one of the problems is that Mohanty ‘does not try to bring them together, rather he shows that they are together’ (15). However, as it turns out, it seems that they are not at all together. Vedāntic philosophy seems to point to a hidden metaphysics phenomenology rejects. Chatterjea would be justified in claiming that phenomenology only deals with experiences and not reality (cf 6), if Husserl maintained that there is reality that is inaccessible and true in itself. However, this would suggest a return to a subjectivism and metaphysical realism that I thought Mohanty was resisting throughout these essays.