Lectures on Philosophical Ethics

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Schleiermacher, Friedrich, Lectures on Philosophical Ethics, edited by Robert B. Louden, translated by Louise Adey Huish, Cambridge University Press, 2002, 296pp, $21.00 (pbk), ISBN 0521007674.

Reviewed by Elizabeth Millan-Zaibert , DePaul University


Robert Louden, the editor of the English translation of F.D.E. Schleiermacher’s Lectures on Philosophical Ethics from 1812/13 and 1816/17, points out that although Schleiermacher is well known in the English speaking world for his contributions to theology and hermeneutics, his contributions to ethics remain “a well kept secret”. In contrast, German scholars emphasize the pivotal role that Schleiermacher’s ethics plays in all of his other work. Louise Adey Huish’s excellent translation of Schleiermacher’s mature lectures on ethics will go a long way towards making his moral theory less of a secret in the Anglophone world. Hence this volume is a most welcome contribution to the growing number of English translations of German texts from the period between Kant and Hegel.

This first ever English translation of Schleiermacher’s Vorlesungen über Ethik, forms part of the Cambridge Texts in the History of Philosophy Series, a series which has also presented translations of Schleiermacher’s work on hermeneutics and criticism (edited by Andrew Bowie) and On Religion: Speeches to its Cultured Despisers (edited by Richard Crouter). The translation is preceded by an introduction which presents a historical overview of Schleiermacher’s ethics. The reader is also provided with a useful chronology of events from the year of Schleiermacher’s birth in 1768 to his death in 1834 and with an annotated list of suggestions for further reading (both English and German titles are provided) on Schleiermacher’s ethical theory. The translation itself is based on two sets of lectures, both delivered at the University of Berlin. The lectures delivered in 1812/13 are the first version of what was slightly reworked and refined in the final version (Letzte Bearbeitung) of 1816/17. Moreover, certain points in both versions of the lectures are expanded upon by annotations which Schleiermacher later added (in 1824, 1827, and 1832, when he lectured on ethics again). These notes are also included in Huish’s translation and often go a long way toward clarifying central points from the text. The Lectures were not published in Schleiermacher’s lifetime; in fact, the German version of the Lectures was not published in complete form until the twentieth century.

In his introduction to Schleiermacher’s text, Louden begins with an overview of Schleiermacher’s pre-1812 writings on ethics. Louden includes a brief discussion of Schleiermacher’s relation to the early German Romantic Movement, referencing some of the texts Schleiermacher wrote during his Berlin years from 1797 to1802 and the important role that figures such as Henriette Herz and Friedrich Schlegel played in Schleiermacher’s philosophical and personal development.

Louden’s self-described “tour” of Schleiermacher’s ethics highlights the influence that Kant’s ethics of duty with its universal leanings had on Schleiermacher’s thought, while also presenting Schleiermacher’s attention to the role of particulars in ethics, that is, Schleiermacher’s focus on individuals and their feelings. Louden describes Schleiermacher as a thinker attempting to “interweave the Kantian philosophy he was raised on with the new Romanticism which he himself helped to create” (ix). Schleiermacher’s “pluralistic ethical program” is traced by Louden to ancient sources (Plato and Aristotle) and also to modern sources, including Spinoza, Kant, and the early German Romantics.

Given Schleiermacher’s strong connection to the early German Romantic movement, the loose way in which Louden characterizes Schleiermacher as an early German Romantic is highly problematic. Clearly, there is nothing wrong with referring to the “romantic Schleiermacher” (xix): it is indeed historically correct to speak in terms of a romantic Schleiermacher, because he was after all a founding member of the early German Romantic Movement that was centered in Berlin during the years 1797-1802. Yet, Louden gives only the scarcest details concerning what the philosophical ramifications of early German Romanticism were for the development of Schleiermacher’s ethical thought, and the details he gives feed into the all too prevalent caricature of the Romantic movement as guided by giddy, love-struck poets.

For example, in his discussion of the role of feeling and fantasy in Schleiermacher’s ethics, Louden tells us that, these “dual themes of feeling and fantasy will resound deeply in early German Romanticism, a movement in which […] Schleiermacher played a key role” (xv). What the “romantic Schleiermacher” offers “in place of the stern ethics of duty” (xix) Louden assimilates to a “60s love-in” (xix). Without more supporting detail for the claim, Louden leaves the reader with a rather distorted image of Romanticism and a misleading notion of the philosophical positions to which the “romantic Schleiermacher” was committed. And while Louden is correct in stating that, “Schleiermacher seeks to balance Kantian concerns with universality, fairness, and impartiality with the Romantics’ stress on individuality, tradition, and local community” (xxvii), he does not provide the support necessary to make the claim a compelling one. Moreover, the emphasis that Schleiermacher places on the process of becoming and his views of the intrinsically incomplete nature of ethical knowledge, some of the most characteristically “romantic” features of the Lectures, are not even mentioned by Louden, who rests comfortably with the view of Romanticism as a movement based on feeling and fantasy.

Despite some imprecision regarding the “romantic Schleiermacher”, Louden’s introduction does offer a reliable and useful sketch of the principle tendencies of Schleiermacher’s ethics: namely, reason’s organizing and symbolizing activities in the historical process of moral self-realization, and attention to both the universal and individual dimensions of ethics.

Louden and the translator, Huish, have done a great service in presenting Schleiermacher’s ethics, “warts and all” to the English reading public. As Louden points out, these lectures “are the closest we will ever get to a full picture of Schleiermacher’s later ethical thought” (xxv). Many of the “warts” are the result of Schleiermacher’s lecture style: he preferred to lecture freely rather than reading from prepared notes, so he only wrote down the headings of key themes that he wanted to cover in his lecture. The manuscripts we have reflect this style, one which would certainly have provided the student audience in Berlin with lively, engaging talks, but which leaves us today with only the skeletal remains of Schleiermacher’s thought. To flesh out some of the cryptic claims made in the manuscript, a wider knowledge of certain tendencies of the philosophical thought of the early German Romantics is necessary.

Schleiermacher begins the Lectures with the claim that, “[t]he communication of a single distinct science cannot have any proper starting-point” (p. 3). This skepticism regarding the starting point of any science shapes many of Schleiermacher’s other claims regarding the fundamentally incomplete and provisional nature of all sciences. Schleiermacher expresses concern about a “false sense of certainty” which gives rise to “the least appropriate respect for other points of view” (§36, p. 6). The definition of ethics that Schleiermacher offers at the beginning of the Lectures reflects his general view that we should not seek final words in our scientific investigations: “We might provisionally define ethics, therefore, as the life of reason, the necessary antithesis of which is acting upon nature” (§13, p. 4). Throughout both versions of the Lectures, Schleiermacher maintains this commitment to the provisional nature of all knowledge claims. He claims that “all knowledge can only be both complete and perfect if it can be taken as a whole” (§6, p. 137), and then in a note goes on to explicitly say that such a view enables us to “give up science but nevertheless to strive for the refining of opinions and the eradication of error” and “to regard science in the highest sense as what is internally complete but at the same time to recognize that in reality science and the depiction of the highest knowledge, can only ever be a reflection, caught up in approximation” (pp. 137-8). Probability is more important than certainty, because in the absence of “any proper starting-point”, the most we can hope for is ever more probable results.

Many of the fragments published in Das Athenäum, a journal edited by Friedrich and August Wilhelm Schlegel between 1798 and 1800, reflect the same skeptical attitude concerning “proper starting-points” of any scientific investigation and the possibility of certain results. Schleiermacher not only contributed to the Schlegel brothers’ journal, but for a period was Friedrich Schlegel’s roommate in Berlin. So, influences of the one upon the other should come as no great surprise, plenty of “symphilosophy” occurred between them, and evidence of their philosophical friendship is found in Schleiermacher’s Lectures.

Along with the romantic skepticism concerning the completeness of any branch of scientific inquiry which flavors the opening remarks of the Lectures, traces of the “romantic Schleiermacher” can also be found in the abundant references to ethics as a “living process of becoming” (§75, p. 25, see also: §66, p. 9; §73, p. 10; §1, p. 26; p. 123, note 26; §190, p. 51; §55, p. 67; §12, p 124). In Athenäum Fragment Nr. 116, which can be read as a kind of manifesto of the early German Romantic movement, Friedrich Schlegel defines romantic poetry as the kind of poetry that is “still in the state of becoming, that, in fact, is its real essence: that it should forever be becoming and never perfected”. This emphasis on becoming is central to the philosophical thought of the early German Romantics: it is tied to their view of the inherent incompleteness of not only poetry, but of philosophy and of knowledge itself. To track the “romantic Schleiermacher”, it is not enough to look at his references to feeling and fantasy, one must investigate the skepticism which frames his discussion of ethics in the Lectures.

After the introductory remarks, in which the “romantic Schleiermacher” discusses ethics as a process of becoming (die Ethik im Werden betrachtet), he begins his detailed treatment of the highest good. Throughout the lectures, Schleiermacher uses the same principal oppositions to shape his discussion of the highest good and the ensuing discussion of the doctrines of virtue and of duty. Schleiermacher presents an opposition between the cognitive and formative/signifying activities of reason, on the one hand, and the opposition between the individual and the universal, on the other. These oppositions highlight Schleiermacher’s interest in exploring the individual and universal elements of moral formation, which he sees as part of the process of the unification of nature with reason. For Schleiermacher, “[a]ll ethical knowledge is the expression of reason becoming nature, a process which has always already begun but is never complete” (Nr. 81, p. 155).1 The formative and cognizing functions of reason are two distinct ways in which we approximate a unity with nature: “Just as the formative function represents more the act whereby reason seizes nature and enters it, so to speak, so the cognitive function represents more the act whereby reason exists in nature and manifests itself there” (§110, p. 40). In the final version of the lectures, given in 1816/17, instead of speaking in terms of the opposition between the formative (bildende) and the cognitive (ekennende) function of reason, Schleiermacher speaks of an opposition between the formative and the signifying (bezeichnende) activity of reason.

While some of the details of his argument are slightly altered and refined in the final version of the Lectures, throughout both versions one thing remains steady: Schleiermacher’s discussion of ethics never strays far from the concrete social structures which moor our actions and our agency. For Schleiermacher, ethics is social and his treatment of ethics is as much about the construction of social reality as it is about ethics, for he sees the two as intimately related. Indeed, for him, the philosopher’s task in ethics has as much to do with outlining the virtues as it does with presenting “the various formative levels in the ethical process” (§239, p. 96). As a result, in the Lectures we find discussions of subjects ranging from agriculture to property, division of labor, money, language, customs, and the state. Schleiermacher explores the development of ethics from within the growth of the personality (he even devotes some time to discussing how the stages of our lives affect our moral personalities). Schleiermacher’s Lectures are at once a theory of ethics and a theory of culture. History, art, language, and tradition each form integral parts of his work on ethics.

A critical feature of an ethical community is what Schleiermacher calls “free sociability” (freie Geselligkeit). This is the community of communication in the individual’s relation to other individuals. Because of the individual-to-individual nature of the relationship characterizing free sociability, this relation stands in sharp contrast to the relationship of the individual to the totality that is approximated in nationality, the church, and the family. Free sociability is manifested in hospitality and friendship, and these form the basis of more inclusive forms of community: the community of states and churches “proceeds from free sociability” (§255, p. 98). According to Schleiermacher’s account of ethics, ever broadening, ever growing sociability (Geselligkeit) is the mark of the moral person: “In general, the inclination of every great moral person is to enter into community with the past and the future; such an inclination can admittedly only be realized through works of (science and?) art, but nevertheless proceeds just as often from free sociability and the state as from the scholarly association of the church” (§259, p. 99).

Schleiermacher’s treatment of the doctrine of virtue and the doctrine of duties is directly related to his discussion of the highest good, because the highest good requires virtues (Nr. 8, p. 101) and the “highest good is the totality of all actions in accordance with duty” (§13, p. 124). Virtue, he tells us, is that which determines whether one is worthy of happiness, but it is not sufficient to generate happiness (Nr. 10, p. 101). Schleiermacher pays due attention to both the individual aspects of virtue and the community aspects of virtue in the path towards the highest good. No individual can possess the highest good, it can only be produced by virtue in everyone (Nr. 9, p. 101). Schleiermacher discusses virtue as disposition, with love (disposition in depiction) and wisdom (disposition in cognition) central here. He distinguishes virtue as disposition (Gesinnung) from virtue as skill (Fertigkeit), claiming that: “Virtue understood as the pure ideal content of action is disposition. Virtue understood as reason set into temporal form is skill” (Nr. 17, p. 102). Skill is what gives disposition its force, without skill, disposition would be “merely an idea” (p. 102). Prudence (Besonnenheit) is cognition set into temporal form (Nr. 20, p. 103) and steadfastness (Beharrlichkeit) is depiction set into temporal form (Nr. 20, p. 103). Steadfastness and prudence are the basic virtues as skills from which all other skills develop. Schleiermacher then discusses the doctrine of duties, covering the duty of right (Rechtspflicht) and the duty of profession (Berufspflicht): the discussion of duty is expanded in the final version of the Lectures to include duty of conscience and duty of love.

There is an extensive treatment of love in the Lectures; love is after all one of the two primary virtues that Schleiermacher analyzes in his discussion of virtue as disposition. An extensive note added by Schleiermacher to his lecture notes in 1827 adds significant detail to his treatment of love as a virtue. He distinguishes self-love from love for God (which, in Spinozistic fashion, he equates with love for nature) and the love associated with justice, tying all of this to his focus on common life and communities. Yet, this attention to love is hardly what makes Schleiermacher a romantic. His ties to early German Romanticism did commit Schleiermacher to a general concern with community and with social justice, which helps to explain his frequent references to equality between the sexes, even in marriage (§23, p. 63 and p. 111, note 2). Certainly, the Romantics do take feelings seriously, breaking with the tradition of positing a tension between reason and feeling. Their concern with feelings is not really much at all like a “60s love-in”, but is rather a serious philosophical concern.

Anyone interested in learning more of the skepticism that characterizes early German Romanticism will benefit from a careful study of the Lectures. Beyond the value of the volume for the history of ideas, these lectures are a fine example of Schleiermacher’s original thought, representing an ambitious effort to analyze the highest good as it develops within history, culture, and society in both individuals and communities.


1. Throughout the final version of the Lectures and in parts of the first version, there are no section symbols; the headings are simply numbered.