Lectures on the History of Moral and Political Philosophy

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G. A. Cohen, Lectures on the History of Moral and Political Philosophy, Jonathan Wolff (ed.), Princeton University Press, 2014, 360pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780691149004.

Reviewed by Ben Laurence, University of Chicago


This book consists of three parts. The first is a collection of G. A. Cohen's lectures on the history of moral and political philosophy. It contains lectures on Plato, Hobbes, Locke, Hume, Kant, Hegel, and Nietzsche. The second gathers together four uncollected papers and one book review, mainly on Marx and Marxism. The third is a brief intellectual memoir of Cohen by Jonathan Wolff, the editor of the volume, usefully mapping the themes and preoccupations of the different stages of Cohen's career.

Wolff worries in the preface that Cohen's historical lectures will be unfavorably compared to those of John Rawls. As Wolff points out, the two had very different methods of engaging with historical material. Rawls' model is the great conversation. We sympathetically approach historical figures as great thinkers, trying to nurture a hard won understanding of their thought as a whole. We assume throughout that they are profound philosophers who are unlikely to have made obvious mistakes. This lifetime engagement with historical sources allows us to participate in this great conversation, as we take up ideas from some figures, presenting and arguing for them in our own terms, and self-consciously leave others behind.

Cohen's method is something different altogether. Instead of the great conversation, it's trench warfare. First there has to be something worth fighting about, a claim or conviction about justice with some contemporary relevance that is traceable to an historical text. With laser-like focus, Cohen reconstructs the argument for this claim. He then approaches the argument from several carefully worked out angles, testing the various inferential connections between premises, and arguing that they fail for a variety of reasons. Having done this, he steps back and asks about the credentials of the premises from which the argument begins. They sound plausible, but are they true? When these fall, he considers whether the line might be held further back. Inch by inch, the battle is fought. Matters of great pitch and moment are explored in combative spirit through the painstaking interrogation of historical texts. There's more than one way to do the history of political philosophy, but Cohen's way, at its best, is superb.

This method is on most dazzling display in Self-Ownership, Freedom and Equality. There, Cohen triangulates between contemporary libertarians, especially Robert Nozick, and two historical figures, John Locke and Karl Marx. His initial target is the use that right libertarians make of the thesis of self-ownership to argue for the justice of unequal holdings. The interrogation of Locke for these purposes is to the point, since Nozick's view departs from reflections on the Second Treatise of Government. However, as the work unfolds, Cohen pushes the discussion further back, ultimately calling into question the thesis of self-ownership itself. This adds a layer of pathos, for Cohen was drawn to consider this thesis partly because (he believed) it was shared ground between right libertarians and Marxists. Bringing Marx into relation with Locke and his libertarian stepchildren was his way of exploring and ultimately rejecting parts of his own heritage.

Some of the lectures on the history of moral and political philosophy in Part One live up to this high standard. His lectures on Hobbes, while not revolutionary, are especially lucid and penetrating. Drawing on Leviathan and De Cive, with some deft use of secondary literature (Gregory Kavka, David Gauthier, Leo Strauss), and related game theoretical treatments (Jon Elster, T. C. Schelling), Cohen presents a clear and interesting account of what he sees as three independent, and perhaps conflicting, lines of argument for the claim that the state of nature is a state of war. Cohen then provides a similar treatment of the different lines of argument justifying political obligation, offering some pertinent criticism of the arguments along the way. His approach throughout the lecture is to pull out the different threads of the text, developing each into an interesting argument. He leaves how and if these pieces can be put back together an open question. Although it does not aspire to present a tidy package, the discussion as a whole is refreshing and illuminating. While perhaps not quite rising to this high level, the lecture focusing on Locke's account of political obligation is an excellent supplement to Cohen's justly famous earlier treatments of Locke on property. The lecture on Hume's criticism of the social contract tradition is interesting, if highly critical.

But some of the lectures are not so good. Cohen's death left some of them in a state of disrepair, while others are quite dated. Worst is the very old lecture on Kant's moral philosophy. The only secondary source on Kant's moral philosophy that Cohen cites is H. J. Paton. Unfortunately, when he wrote it, Cohen did not have access to the tremendous and hard won advances in understanding Kant's practical philosophy from a generation of first-rate scholars like Allen Wood, Barbara Herman, Christine Korsgaard, Andrews Reath, and Stephen Engstrom. Nor, unlike Rawls, was he a devoted and keen student of Kant's thought himself. Predictably, the results are less than dazzling. Cohen argues that Kant works with twelve distinctions that he needs to be mutually exclusive and exhaustive, as well as congruent. He then writes, "From all this there emerge 90 possible errors in Kant: 24 relating to the exhaustivity and exclusivity of each distinction, 66 to the question of congruency. I think Kant fails on about 40 of the counts" (153). It pains me to say that this is the sort of approach to the history of philosophy that gives us analytic philosophers a bad name. Take a profound and difficult philosopher that one could profitably spend a lifetime studying, slap down a 12x12 grid of distinctions as they would be drawn by a contemporary Oxford philosopher, convict the thinker of some quantifiable number of errors, and call it a day. What could the point of this exercise be?

Perhaps the objects of greatest curiosity for those familiar with Cohen's work are his lectures on Hegel, on the master-slave relation, and on Nietzsche's critique of slave morality. The first finds Cohen throwing up his hands at one point, admitting his difficulty and exasperation with The Phenomenology of Spirit with characteristic wit:  "By virtue of the obscurity of the relevant texts, and my own limited telepathic powers, I cannot offer a limpid exposition of these sections of the book" (188-89). The second lecture is more interesting. It contains a subtle attempt to discuss Nietzsche's use of the metaphors of health and sickness, and his appeal to aesthetic criteria, in his critique of moral values. Whether it will satisfy those who have spent much time with Nietzsche's texts, I cannot say, but I certainly found it fascinating.

Part Two collects previously uncollected essays by Cohen. They are a good but heterogeneous lot. The first two are very early pieces on Marx. "Bourgeois and Proletarians" addresses the sense in which not only the worker, but the capitalist as well, can be said to be alienated under capitalism. Although there is reason to expect the capitalist to be satisfied with his alienation, Cohen argues that he is alienated nonetheless, since he fails in a drastic way to express the productive essence of humanity. His life is thus, in a certain sense, empty, although he does not experience it to be so. The topic is important for understanding the view of the young Marx, and the treatment is original. Cohen makes several suggestive points that deserve to be followed up.

The second of these early pieces considers an obvious problem that seems to arise for Marx's theory of ideology. The question is why Marx's own theories do not fall prey to the same sort of ideological illusion and error of which he convicts bourgeois theories. True, the class interests they serve are different, but does not the same point apply mutatis mutandis? Cohen casts this as tu quoque argument, and helpfully groups it together with the common charges against relativism, and reductive views about thought and reason. He notes several lines of reply in Marx, but focuses his attention on a rather simple one. Since the vast majority of society is working class, the working class does not need to propound erroneous and illusory doctrines in order to win other classes over to its cause. Although it's good, this and the previous essay both predate Cohen's turn to "no-bullshit Marxism". There is a tendency in these essays for dogmatic assertion and a willingness to make bold claims of untested validity and unclear force. Although they are well worth reading for those interested in Marx, they're not quite Cohen as we've come to know and love him.

The third, later, essay is Cohen's reply to Jon Elster's criticism of his formulation of Marx's theory of history. Here we have further skirmishing on the validity and nature of functionalist explanations, familiar from the intramural debates among analytic Marxists. It is an important addendum to these debates, and I recommend it to anyone interested in the viability of that research program. The fourth is a fine review of Allen Wood's Karl Marx, in the course of which Cohen makes some interesting remarks on Marx's views about justice. The fifth and last essay in the section is a reprint of Cohen's reply to Christine Korsgaard's Tanner Lectures, both of which were printed previously in The Sources of Normativity. It was a pleasure to read this essay in this collection, since it has surprising echoes and resonances with his lectures on Hobbes.

Finally, in the Part Three we have Wolff's brief intellectual biography of Cohen, focusing primarily on the arguments and topics preoccupying Cohen at different stages of his career. I recommend this warm but terse biography as a starting point for anyone interested in approaching Cohen's thought as a whole. It is a valuable overview and introduction, provided by a brilliant student who knew and loved both the work and the man.

In summary, the collection is a mixed bag that contains some gems, but does not always play to Cohen's strengths. Who should buy this book? Anyone who is seriously engaged with Cohen's work should certainly buy it. Anyone who is interested in Marxism, especially "no-bullshit" analytic Marxism. Finally, anyone who is curious to see how Cohen grappled, not always successfully, with teaching and thinking about historical figures. While this is certainly not everyone, it's more than enough to justify Wolff's undertaking to collect between two covers, and get into print, the missing pieces of Cohen's oeuvre.