Lectures on the History of Philosophy 1825-6: Volume I: Introduction and Oriental Philosophy

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Georg W.F. Hegel, Lectures on the History of Philosophy 1825-6: Volume I: Introduction and Oriental Philosophy, Robert F. Brown (ed., tr.), Oxford UP, 2009, 323 pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199568932.

Reviewed by Robert R. Williams, University of Illinois at Chicago



The new translation from Oxford University Press is the first critical edition of Hegel’s Lectures on the History of Philosophy available in English. It supersedes in many respects the previous translation. The merit and value of the new translation can be best appreciated by comparing it with the older, less expensive version. Haldane’s and Simson’s work is not bad as a translation, but it is more than 100 years old, and its irremediable defect is that it is a translation of the second German edition, the least desirable edition of Hegel’s History of Philosophy Lectures. Since the Haldane translation has been very influential and widely reprinted, a word of explanation is in order.

The second German edition of Hegel’s Lectures on the History of Philosophy in the Werke (1840-1844) was prepared by Michelet, in part as a response to criticisms made of his first edition (1833-6). Michelet’s first German edition is the richest in source materials, which include Hegel’s own lecture manuscripts, transcriptions and/or fair copies made by his students over a period of several years. However, in the first edition these disparate materials were not distinguished or identified for the reader. Michelet’s concern was to produce something like a book that appeared to issue from a single source, instead of a compilation of lectures delivered over a period of several years. Consequently Michelet freely mixed Hegel’s own lecture manuscripts, which are of higher historical critical value, with student transcripts. Further, Michelet did not bother to compare critically the divergent formulations in his sources, and did not critically evaluate the sources, especially the student transcripts. Michelet’s method was to interweave the several sources he had into a single text in such a way that the external juxtaposition of sources would not be apparent to the reader, so that the text seemed to issue as a whole from the spirit of the author in a single outpouring, i.e., as a unified book, not a compendium of several sources and lecture series. The result was that Michelet leveled the difference between Hegel’s notes and those of his students, and leveled the differences between the student transcriptions.

The first German edition (1833-6) received severe criticism from many contemporaries who had attended Hegel’s lectures. The attempt to make the lecture material book-like was not successful and did violence to the material. For example, Johann Eduard Erdmann attributed to Michelet’s editorial treatment of material part of the blame for mistakes commonly attributed to Hegel.

Criticisms like this led to a second German edition (1840-44). Michelet’s response to criticisms of the 1836 edition was a thorough revision that tried to make the material even more book-like with fewer repetitions and even more amalgamation of materials. He reworked the materials of the first edition by blending phrases and by eliminating long and repetitive passages. Precisely these editorial principles of blending texts and expressions into a single editorially constructed narrative are what today cause the second German edition to be regarded as unsuccessful. For Michelet’s revisions in the second edition were not the result of new and better source materials, or of a critical differentiation of Hegel’s lecture manuscripts from student transcripts, but merely an editorial reworking of the earlier edition to make it appear more like a book from a single author. The Haldane-Simson English translation translates the least valuable second German edition (1840-44).

In the 1940’s there were efforts to produce a German critical edition by Hoffmeister. Hoffmeister separates Hegel’s manuscript material from the student transcripts. But Hoffmeister’s work remains incomplete and inconsistently implemented. The new German critical edition is intended as a replacement for Hoffmeister’s edition.

We are confronted by the paradox that Michelet, who could draw upon his living memory of Hegel’s lectures he attended in 1823-4, produced not one but two editorially constructed texts that blurred and leveled the differences of his source materials. On the other hand, our contemporary German editors, who obviously did not attend Hegel’s lectures and whose understanding of Hegel’s thought was shaped and mediated by Michelet’s edition, have through critical comparisons and text-critical methods tried to distinguish what Michelet amalgamated, and by drawing upon fewer but still extant transcripts have tried to evaluate the sources and to produce less misleading and more accurate texts of those lectures than did Michelet. But these editors also concede that there are limits to what modern scholarship can achieve: The project of producing a critical edition has been frustrated by the loss of many of the original materials, including the loss of all of Hegel’s manuscripts. Because of the loss of these materials, no new edition can be produced following text and source critical methods that equals or surpasses the material richness of the original 1833-6 edition. Although it does not make use of or exhibit modern editorial practices, the first Michelet edition remains the most complete compilation of the source material available.

The new German edition concentrates on the lectures from Hegel’s Berlin period (1819, 1820, 1825-6, 1827-8, 1829-30, and 1831) for which there are distinct lecture transcripts. The version of the lecture course the editors have selected as the lead text is the 1825-6 version. It was chosen for the simple, pragmatic reason that it is by far the best attested by five transcripts. This mutual attestation of the best available transcripts allows the editors to reconstruct the material comparatively with a high degree of authenticity. The advantage of focusing on one year’s lectures is that it provides a better glimpse of Hegel’s delivery of the history of philosophy in the course of a single academic term, and reconstitutes this lecture course in more reliable form than did Michelet.

There is a drawback, namely the content of the lectures is somewhat reduced in comparison with the original Michelet edition (1833-6). But this is not a serious disadvantage or omission, for two reasons.

1) The German editors point out that while Hegel’s academic practice throughout his teaching career was to teach the history of philosophy as an introduction to philosophy, beginning with its most abstract formulations and working towards ever more concrete and developed ideas, most of the development (if any) in Hegel’s conception of the history of philosophy had already occurred prior to his arrival in Berlin, and the early materials that might document such development have all been lost. All of the available materials come from the Berlin period, where there is little revision or development, but rather different emphases.

2) The 1825-6 transcript which the German editors reconstruct and present more reliably than did Michelet, should be understood, not as a replacement for Michelet’s first edition (1833-6) but only as a corrective to Michelet’s editorial practices of amassing all the materials indistinguishably and failing to correct the numerous errors and discrepancies in his sources. Consequently, the new German critical edition, translated into English, does not replace or supersede, but rather complements the original German edition (1833-6) that still remains today the richest in source materials.

So where does this leave the English reader interested in Hegel’s history of philosophy lectures? First, if the 1825-6 lead text is a corrective to editorial practices of the first German edition, it should also serve as a corrective to the even worse editorial practices of the second German edition presented in the older English translation. It is a more accurate, reliable text based on a single academic year’s presentation. However, the English reader should be aware that this is a somewhat reduced text, and that the German editors recommend that since it is not intended to replace the original (1833-6) edition, but only serve as a correction, it should be used in conjunction with the original. Consequently, those who require the maximum content and information (if in an editorially constructed form) will have to make use of the untranslated 1833-6 original edition, which remains widely available — for example in the Suhrkamp edition of Hegel’s Werke. Those who have worked with the Haldane translation and compared it with the first Michelet edition, know that the latter is both richer in sources and more repetitive than the edition that Haldane translated. Sometimes this can be advantageous, particularly as long as one does not ascribe all the repetitions to Hegel’s pedagogical practice.

Second, with respect to flow of thought and readability, the new edition is a simpler, less complicated text (less editorial amalgamation) that is a more direct and in my opinion a more readable expression of ideas and arguments that are complex and difficult. Most of the time, this is a clear advantage. One does not have to deal with passages of text that have been torn from their original context - a potential fallacy — and inserted in a different context and narrative that potentially alters their meaning.

Third, the new translation itself is the product of an experienced translation team that has worked together for nearly 25 years translating Hegel’s Lectures on the Philosophy of Religion and Philosophy of Right. It is a team that has worked on translation issues and compiled glossaries for most of Hegel’s lectures, and for this reason their translation is superior in both accuracy and readability to Haldane’s and Simson’s. If it remains true that every translation is an interpretation of its original text, the translation of these materials has gone through more stages of scholarly debate and review than the earlier translation. Haldane and Simson do not offer a glossary of terms, or ways of easily checking their text against the German original, all of which are important aids for the contemporary English reader.

Finally, this first volume includes the introductions to the History of Philosophy, which are those portions of the lectures that were most revised and rewritten by Hegel. For those interested in Hegel’s defense of the History of Philosophy as a discipline of philosophy, this is the most important volume. For those interested in Hegel’s views of the study of philosophy in relation to religion, art, ethics and politics, this is an important volume because it presents Hegel’s discussion of Chinese and Indian Philosophy. Hegel’s introductions to his History of Philosophy are presented here for the first time in their differentiation: 1819, 1820-1, 1823-4, 1825-6, 1827-8 and 1829-30. Presented in their discrete lecture series, the repetitions are more tolerable, useful and intelligible than if blended together into a single text. And it becomes easier to track the treatment and elaboration of certain key concepts such as freedom, the idea as a self-generating organism, the concepts of abstract and concrete, through parallel formulations in different courses. This is not to claim or suggest that there is a development in Hegel’s thought itself in these different lectures, but rather that our understanding of Hegel’s thought, its key concepts, etc., can develop and be improved. For what comes through is a better understanding of one of the most powerful justifications of the study of the history of philosophy as philosophy.

Hegel is well aware of and takes seriously skeptical objections to philosophy based on the diversity of philosophies. The diversity and opposition of philosophies — all claiming to be true — is taken by skeptics as a refutation not only of philosophy but of the idea of truth. In an era in which the unattainability of truth is widely acknowledged, and when on the other hand, “philosophy” has become a narrow, esoteric specialty riven with ferocious professional disputes that question, if not dismiss any philosophical writing before 1911 as “unphilosophie” and “untrue”, and when some might prefer to assign the history of philosophy to departments of history, Hegel’s lectures can serve as a reminder that there are alternatives. For Hegel the history of philosophy is not a self-destructive demolition derby that leaves nothing standing. For while on the empirical historical level every philosophy has been refuted, on another level no genuine philosophy has ever been refuted. For Hegel the history of philosophy is also a defense of philosophical diversity as stages in the development of philosophy as a whole. In spite of Hegel’s apparently immodest claim to be giving an account of the whole that incorporates, justifies and supersedes all its stages as partial truths, he believes only that this whole itself is important, not that his own account of this whole is final. Nor does he believe that the history of philosophy is properly regarded as a series of warm-up exercises for the “big brains” of the present age that have finally solved all the important problems and entered the promised land.

As his lectures make evident, Hegel takes the history of philosophy seriously as philosophy. In that history, spirit is both present and coming to be for itself in freedom. This means that

The will that is free is the will whose purpose is universal, for in what is universal I am equal to myself. Connected with this point is the fact that other people are like me, are free, for others are just as universal as I am … from which it follows that I am free only insofar as I posit the freedom of others, and that I am free only insofar as others acknowledge me to be free. Freedom is actual, existing freedom only when shared with others" (1823-4, p. 231).

If this larger concern about what the history of philosophy is about is lost, then the only thing that may be missing from the many philosophies and histories of philosophy is philosophy itself.