Lectures on the History of Political Philosophy

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John Rawls, Lectures on the History of Political Philosophy, Samuel Freeman (ed.), Harvard University Press, 2007, 459pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674024922.

Reviewed by J. B. Schneewind, Johns Hopkins University


John Rawls's Lectures on the History of Moral Philosophy, edited by Barbara Herman, was published in 2000 by Harvard University Press. Rawls there discusses the moral philosophies of Hume, Leibniz, Kant, and Hegel. In the Lectures on the History of Political Philosophy (hereafter: LHPP) he covers Hobbes, Locke, Hume, Rousseau, John Stuart Mill, Marx, Sidgwick and Butler. Although Hume's view of justice is treated in both volumes, there is otherwise no significant overlap; and the discussion of it in LHPP has a different focus than that in the moral philosophy lectures. (Kant's political philosophy is covered briefly in the latter, pp. 362-6.)

Discussing Sidgwick, Rawls makes a remark that gives us a good way of understanding one of the things he is doing in all these lectures. "Sidgwick's originality … ," Rawls says, "lies in his view that a reasoned and satisfactory justification of any particular moral conception must proceed from a full knowledge and systematic comparison of the more significant moral conceptions in the philosophical tradition." (LHPP 379) In A Theory of Justice and his other systematic works Rawls touches on moral conceptions other than his own, but gives no full treatment of them. His historical lectures richly provide such comparisons. Rawls says that he is "trying to think through a few political conceptions, all the way through, if possible." (LHPP 139) He concentrates on political theories that he sees as the ancestors of various forms of liberal thought. He starts with social contract theories; discusses Hume's objections to such theories; presents a detailed discussion of Mill's non-contractual version of liberalism; and then considers Marx's criticisms of liberal capitalism. The lectures on Sidgwick clarify essential points of utilitarianism. Those on Butler elaborate on moral psychology and emphasize the importance of a thinker's background beliefs -- in this case deistic. They also contain significant remarks on method in ethical theory. But they do not directly address the political questions that are the focus of most of the lectures.

Setting Sidgwick and Butler aside, I will summarize -- regretfully omitting much illuminating detail -- Rawls' treatment of his main figures and then comment on his way of presenting the history of political theory.

Contract theories all rely on the persuasiveness of the thought that agreement or consent can justify authority (LHPP 159-60). Hobbes did not originate social contract doctrine but, Rawls holds, he did write the single most impressive work of political philosophy in English; and the opposition he aroused makes him the originator of modern work on the subject. Writing at a time of religiously driven civil upheaval and war, his central problem is to convince his readers that they are better off with an absolutist sovereign than with any other alternative. To do this he appeals to basic interests he thinks everyone has. Each man wants to protect his life, assure himself of the means to live well, protect the well-being of those he loves, and not risk his hope of eternal reward. Rawls argues that despite some of his assertions Hobbes is not a psychological egoist. For his political purpose he is calling on motivations he thinks everyone would have even if there were no ruler. These are the interests of men in a state of nature.

The argument is that with these interests it is rational for all to authorize one person (individual or corporate) to exercise absolute political power to enforce the laws of nature. Each person's compliance is rational provided everyone else complies as well. The laws themselves spell out a reasonable conception of how men should act. But for Hobbes the ground anyone has to accept them is solely rational self-interest, broadly understood. Hence Hobbes has no room for a genuine conception of moral obligation, which requires "some concern for fairness … and for honoring promises even when we might do better." (LHPP 71) Hobbes holds that any laws the sovereign enacts must be just. But they may not be good, because they may not help preserve peace. And the point of having a sovereign at all is to secure peace.

Hobbes would force us to choose between absolutism and anarchy. Rawls thinks this unsatisfactory. Constitutional democratic regimes have in fact endured for protracted periods. But they require cooperation based on reasonable self-restraint and a sense of fairness, and Hobbes cannot allow either of these. The question then is: how can a social contract doctrine be framed so as to remedy Hobbes's defects? (LHPP 87-8)

Locke takes some steps toward an answer. His problem is not the same as Hobbes's. Locke needs to find a justification for setting limits to royal authority in a mixed constitution, where the Crown shares power with Parliament. (LHPP 105) The Exclusion Crisis of 1679-81 made the issue urgent; and Locke, as Rawls says several times, risked his life through his political activities as well as his writings, in his efforts to protect individual liberty from government encroachment.

Locke's state of nature differs from Hobbes's, in that it has a law which protects property. All adults are free and equal, every man a king. The basic laws of nature derive somehow from God's will. (Rawls thinks Locke has serious problems spelling out just how. (LHPP 111 n.13)) They require us to preserve our lives, respect property, protect the innocent, and help others. Against Filmer, Locke argues that God has not instituted any political superiority in the state of nature. Can we see a good reason why men might have surrendered some of their natural rights to a limited sovereign? The problem Rawls sees is that Locke thinks that men contract into a class state. They agree that only the wealthy shall vote. The poor will not be enfranchised.

Does this show a basic inconsistency in Locke's views? Rawls thinks it does not. We must keep in mind that all of those in the state of nature know about one another's property holdings. Some have threat advantages over others, and everyone knows this. (LHPP 151-2) Given that there is no "veil of ignorance" Rawls shows how there is a conceivable "ideal history" in which rational and reasonable agents who are free and equal could agree to a class state. Locke is not inconsistent. But his ideal history hinges on historical contingencies. He can get what is at best a conditional settlement, which would have to be reconsidered after any significant shift in property holdings. Rawls objects: "the basic freedoms and opportunities of a constitutional regime should be fixed far more solidly than that." (LHPP 155). Locke's contract doctrine must be revised.

Before turning to Rousseau's revisions, Rawls presents Hume's objections to using the idea of contract to explain justice. Hume, he points out, is not offering to explain the normative validity of moral and political principles, as Locke does. He is rather giving a naturalistic psychological explanation of how we come to have the central concepts they use. Rawls then gives a meticulous account of the essay "Of the Original Contract". Where Locke takes the idea of promising as "somehow given" (LHPP 160, cf. 175), Hume offers a psychological account of it (LHPP 169) which is meant to show that utility does the heavy work of explaining our obligations, including the obligation to keep a contract. The concept of contract is here quite idle.

Rawls says that Hume's criticisms were historically very effective: after them Locke's view had no successors. But Hume thinks Locke holds that our present obedience to government depends on a contract made in the past. Locke however explicitly disavows that interpretation of consent. He uses his conception of consent, moreover, to provide a test or criterion of legitimacy in a government. And Hume simply does not address that issue. But the really substantive question about the two views, as Rawls sees it, is whether their differing accounts of justice would lead to different basic structures for society. Will reliance on utility select the same "family of political regimes" as reliance on consent?  Here again Hume is simply silent. (LHPP 170-3)

Hume gives only a very "loose" account of the principle of utility, Rawls says, and he anticipates his own later lectures to give a more precise version. He stresses that for the utilitarian the good must be explained with no reliance on conceptions of the right. He also argues that there is a connection between Hume's impartial spectator theory and his substantive reliance on utility. Rawls raises some questions about this connection that Hume does not take up but concludes that for Hume's purposes his account is more or less adequate. (LHPP 183)

Rousseau is primarily concerned, Rawls says, to criticize the society of his times, particularly its vast and pervasive inequalities of wealth, power and status. Some critics think Rousseau is "a dazzling though confused and inconsistent writer." "Don't believe it", Rawls says, (LHPP 200) and he works out a persuasive reading to show how consistent he is. Rousseau's Discourse on the Origins of Inequality gives a narrative that grounds his critique of inequality. It also opens the way to Rousseau's important theory of how society shapes men's most fundamental motivations and character, a matter to which Rawls pays much attention.

Rousseau is everywhere conscious of, and outraged by, the vice and harm due to inequality. In the Social Contract he shows us what principles of right and justice need to be realized in a society that would avoid impermissible inequality. His contract, unlike Locke's, would give all citizens -- well, anyway all men -- an equal share in political power. He also argues that everyone is free in a society in which each is a legislator of the laws all must obey. Rousseau's contract ranges further than the contracts proposed by previous thinkers, and he has a deeper view of the significance of equality. Justice as fairness, Rawls adds, "follows Rousseau" closely in both these respects. (LHPP 266)

John Stuart Mill set himself a task different from those of the earlier theorists Rawls has studied. He aimed to educate his society so that it would adopt the principles of a new modern world to come. Seeing his own age as transitional, he wanted to prepare the way for a secular society of justice, equality and liberty. (LHPP 251-2, 297-8)  Mill's style, aimed at swaying the public, is consequently sometimes loose, calling for interpretation. The chief aim of Rawls's interpretation is to show that though Mill is a kind of utilitarian, the basic structure of society as he would have it is essentially the same as the basic structure called for by Rawls's own justice as fairness. The question is how Mill's utilitarianism leads him to such Rawlsian results.           

The answer is complex. Mill's utilitarianism is very different from that of Bentham and Sidgwick. They all agree that happiness is to be maximized, and that the principle of maximizing happiness is the ultimate criterion for settling moral difficulties. (LHPP 272) But Mill allows for values other than pleasures, and he thinks some pleasures qualitatively outrank others. Which pleasures are higher is to be determined by the "decided preference" test. If those who have experienced both kinds of pleasure regularly prefer one kind to another, the preferred kind is higher.

Now pleasures, for Mill, are not simply felt, introspectable mental states. They are activities tied to modes of life. And we all feel that some modes of life are more dignified and more suited to our natures than others. In addition to our attachment to dignity, we want to live in unity with other people. Mill takes this to mean that people want to act justly or to act from a principle of reciprocity. This is a desire that increases in strength as civilization advances. We recognize more and more that we must take everyone's interests equally into account if we are to have a society that respects dignity. Mill's account of justice, as protecting legal rights, realizing moral rights, giving people what they deserve, keeping faith, and judging impartially, spells out how this is to work.

In addition to these interests we have an equally basic interest in personal liberty: in being able to decide for ourselves how to live our lives. Mill sees the modern threat to liberty as coming not from sovereign authority but from public opinion, which suppresses individuality and aims at mindless conformity. The principle of allowing maximal liberty to each so long as others are not harmed is, Mill thinks, a "principle of public reason" for a coming democratic age. (LHPP 286-7) And if people are properly educated and free to try out different modes of life, they will be able to find out for themselves which activities are best suited to their own natures.

Mill's psychological doctrine is that everyone has the basic interests here sketched; and he holds that social progress will be assured in proportion as they are satisfied. Maximizing utility requires, then, maximizing the extent to which these "permanent interests of man as a progressive being" are realized. Thus utility requires equal rights to freedom of thought and speech, including religious freedom, freedom to choose one's career and way of living, equality in marriage, and assurance that public aid will be available to help those who are temporarily unable to help themselves. The rights are justified by their protecting our basic interests. And Mill seems to suppose that maximizing happiness and protecting all these rights will always amount to the same thing. Rawls thinks that Mill's view and his own are close to forming an "overlapping consensus". (LHPP267-8) But he is uneasy about Mill's way of resting his theory on a psychological doctrine so complex and open to challenge.

Rawls treats Marx in admittedly narrow terms solely as a critic of liberalism. He opens his first lecture by stating four of Marx's objections to it and sketching brief replies to them. (LHPP 320-1) He discusses in some detail the vexed issue of whether Marx does or does not have a theory of justice, concluding that in an important way he does. Implicitly, or in his heart, Rawls concludes, Marx thinks that capitalism yields an unjust society. Marx may not even be aware of the extent to which his statements have this implication. (LHPP 355) He is reluctant to make the injustice of capitalism an explicit objection, because he thinks it would be useless, or even harmful, to highlight the issue.

Marx also thinks that when capitalism is overcome and a "society of freely associated producers" (LHPP 359) has been created, there will be no further need for thinking about justice. Those thoughts belong to ideological consciousness, which will vanish with capitalism. Alienation will also vanish. What we will have is a society in which there is no exploitation, and in which everyone equally shares in society's wealth and in its politics. Thus the Marxist ideal seems to be a fully just society. But it is in an important way a society "beyond justice". The reason is that "the members of communist society are not people moved by the principles and virtues of justice … a troubled concern about justice, and debates about what justice requires, are not part of their common life. These people," Rawls comments, "are strange to us; it is hard to describe them." (LHPP 371)

Although this feature of the ideal society attracted Marx, Rawls finds it undesirable. Justice will not come about without citizens who have and are aware of a concern for it. "Having a sense of justice … is part of human life … To act always as we have a mind to act without worrying about or being aware of others' claims, would be a life lived without an awareness of the essential conditions of a decent human society." (LHPP 372)

The "Introduction" to these lectures is an essay on the authority and social roles of political philosophy, and its audience. For Rawls political philosophy in modern society has no special authority. It is simply a continuation -- more intense and perhaps more coherent -- of what citizens are able to think concerning their own political institutions. Rawls insists that it is distinctive of modernity to consider every normal adult as capable of reasoning about political matters. To say that reason is to settle issues is just to say that we must "present our views with their supporting grounds in a reasonable and sound manner so that others may judge them intelligently. "(LHPP 2) This is a fine introduction to the lectures and -- beyond that -- an essay that should be read by anyone engaged in working on the subject.

Rawls says he follows Collingwood in taking it that political philosophy is "a series of answers to different questions" arising from various pressing problems in the societies in which the theories were produced. (LHPP xiii.) Though he qualifies this later, noting that there are "certain basic questions that we keep on asking", (LHPP 103) he does, as I have indicated above, orient his discussions by outlining the problem each of his subjects took as central. His main concern, however, is to get at the main arguments in the texts he teaches. He stands apart from the contextualizing work done by Quentin Skinner and John Pocock and the many historians who follow them. He nowhere mentions civic humanism and classical republicanism, though much of the literature about them was available while Rawls was lecturing. His approach is closer to that of the classical work of George H. Sabine than to the kind represented in the recent Cambridge University Press volumes on the history of political theory.

His agreement with Collingwood, moreover, does not take him as far as it might. He does not try to relate the works by his theorists to the common languages of political thought, as shaped by the politicians, historians, preachers, rhetoricians, journalists, party apologists, pamphleteers and essayists of their times. He says once or twice that it would be inappropriate to describe a given work in some way because the writer himself would not have used such language. (LHPP 82, 368) Yet he describes the main argument in each of his major philosophers in terms of what would be done or accepted by "rational and reasonable" agents in his own specific sense of those terms. His subjects do not use that vocabulary; and Rawls does not have a major interest in recovering the way the past looked to and was described by those who lived it. If this is not in any conventional sense a "Whig" history, it is a most Rawlsian one.

Samuel Freeman has done an admirable job of editing the lectures. In addition to complete lectures he has included various more or less fragmentary notes, some outlines, and some reading lists for students; and he has provided a useful index.[1] One might, of course, offer objections to various points in Rawls's readings. But the lectures as a whole are a brilliant and penetrating interpretation of the liberal tradition. And they are a perfect treasure-house of material for understanding how Rawls saw the relation of his own work to that of his predecessors. Those who were able to hear Rawls give the lectures were very fortunate. We must be thankful that he authorized their publication.[2]

[1] There are very few textual errors. The only one worth noting occurs in the lectures on Butler. At p. 423 the third and second lines from the bottom should read "the happiness of the world is God's concern [not: happiness], not ours."

[2] With thanks to Samuel Freeman for comments on an earlier draft.