Lectures on the Philosophy of World History, Vol. I: Manuscripts of the Introduction and the Lectures of 1822-3

Placeholder book cover

G.W.F. Hegel, Lectures on the Philosophy of World History, Vol. I: Manuscripts of the Introduction and the Lectures of 1822-3, Robert F. Brown and Peter C. Hodgson (eds., trs.), Oxford University Press, 2011, 562pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199601707.

Reviewed by Nicholas Walker, University of Essex


Given the complex editorial history of Hegel's influential and contentious 'book' on the philosophy of history, it may be helpful to outline something of the textual history of the work in order to clarify the precise character and significance of this new edition and translation. Hegel gave five series of lectures on the philosophy of history at the University of Berlin between 1822 and 1831, the year of his death. As with the lectures on the philosophy of religion, these lectures developed in considerable detail a dimension of Hegel's mature thought that had not been independently presented at any length in his earlier lectures or publications. As is well known, all of the great cycles of lectures from the Berlin period were eventually published in one form or another, on the basis of student transcripts and surviving autograph manuscripts, and with varying degrees of editorial adequacy, in the context of the original edition of Hegel's Werke (the 'Freundesvereinsausgabe') assembled after his death by various former students and members of the Hegelian School between 1832 and 1845 (the volumes including the Berlin lectures constituted more than half the entire series).

The first edition of the 'philosophy of history' was brought out in 1837 by Hegel's friend and student Eduard Gans who felt his task was 'to produce a book' out of the mass of materials at his disposal. He was well aware that the actual presentation of Hegel's philosophy of history evolved considerably over the Berlin years, and Gans undertook to redress a certain imbalance in the discussion of particular themes by producing a composite version drawing on Hegel's autograph manuscripts and student transcripts from all the courses that Hegel delivered on this subject. Until fairly recently, this 'compilatory' procedure, inevitably involving a considerable degree of creative editorial intervention, was followed in different ways by all previous editors of Hegel's lectures.

Thus in 1840 the philosopher's son, Karl Hegel, produced a second, and rather longer, edition of our text which, he claimed, did greater justice to material from the earlier lecture courses and brought out the philosophical structure of the argument more clearly. He also argued that his edition reproduced the original form, style and tone of Hegel's own manuscripts more accurately. Nonetheless, here too autograph manuscripts composed at different times and transcripts based on Hegel's lecture series from different years were combined to form an 'integral' text, without any editorial indications in the published version that would allow the reader to recognize these different materials and sources or to distinguish between Hegel's manuscripts and the student transcripts. It was a reprint of this edition which furnished the basis for John Sibree's translation of the philosophy of history that was published in 1858 and represented the first of Hegel's 'works' to appear in English. (The translation of the 'Introduction' to Hegel's philosophy of history that Robert S. Hartmann published as Reason in History in 1953 was essentially based on the opening part of Karl Hegel's 1840 edition, supplemented with a title and certain details borrowed from more modern editions, and Leo Rauch's translation Introduction to the Philosophy of History of 1988 was also based on the opening parts of the 1840 edition).

 It was only in the first decades of the twentieth century that tentative steps in the direction of something like a more 'critical' approach to the editing of Hegel's posthumously published texts and hitherto unpublished writings were effectively made, although even here old attitudes died hard: thus between 1917 and 1920 Georg Lasson, after considerable criticism of his two predecessors' efforts, produced the most extensive version of Hegel's 'philosophy of history' in four parts (at nearly a thousand pages, almost twice the length of the earlier editions). For the first time, Lasson's edition distinguished typographically between the material based directly on Hegel's autograph manuscripts and that drawn from the various student transcripts of the lectures, but in his fervent commitment to offer the reader the 'whole' of Hegel's legacy he served up a gargantuan quilt of a text exploiting all the transcripts at his disposal and re-using other parts of the 1840 edition, again conflating materials from various courses that Hegel had offered between 1822 and 1831. The opening volume of Lasson's edition, which he entitled 'Reason in History', included the two different 'introductions' to the lectures that survive, albeit fragmentarily, in Hegel's autograph manuscript (the well-known brief introduction based on 'the different ways of treating history' that Hegel offered in 1822 and several times subsequently, and the much longer general introduction that he seems to have used in the final lectures series delivered in 1830-31).

Johannes Hoffmeister re-edited Lasson's first volume in 1955 in the Felix Meiner series of classic philosophical texts, and this edition was soon widely used and cited in the field of Hegelian studies, being translated by H. B. Nisbet under the title Lectures on the Philosophy of World History: Introduction (Cambridge University Press, 1975). Until recently this edition was probably the best available source in English for the serious study of Hegel's thoughts on history, although students without German still had to rely on reprints of Sibree's antiquated translation of Karl Hegel's edition for the rest of Hegel's lectures that went beyond the programmatic introductions and dealt directly with the actual course of history as Hegel interpreted it.

It was only with the advent of the new Critical Edition of Hegel's writings that Meiner Verlag has been publishing from the late 1960s onwards that an entirely fresh approach to the problem of editing all the surviving autograph sources and transcripts was developed with a view to presenting more accurate versions of Hegel's posthumously published lectures and making available the vast mass of other hitherto unpublished notes and materials. In contrast to earlier editions of the lectures, the critical edition insists on clearly separating primary sources, if these still exist, from secondary sources such as transcripts by other hands, and also undertakes to separate out the groups of transcripts that reflect the courses that Hegel delivered over different years in order to avoid conflation and compilation of different materials and the sometimes significant different angles of approach that Hegel adopted over the years to the 'same' subject matter.

This complex textual prehistory brings us finally to the translation in question here and the new German edition on which it is based (Vorlesungen über die Philosophie der Weltgeschichte, Berlin, 1822-3, edited by Karl-Heinz Ilting, Karl Brehmer and Hoo Nam Seelman, vol. 12 of Vorlesungen: Ausgewählte Nachscriften und Manuskripte, Meiner Verlag 1996). For many years now Peter Hodgson, in collaboration with Robert F. Brown and a number of other scholars and translators, has pioneered a series of thorough and careful translations of Hegel's lecture courses based on the ongoing textual research behind the Critical Edition, beginning with the three volumes of Hegel's lectures on the philosophy of religion first published by University of California Press in the 1980s. This ambitious project has continued with new versions of Hegel's lectures on the philosophy of right, the history of philosophy, logic, aesthetics, and the philosophy of spirit, although Oxford University Press has now taken over the ongoing publication of the series.

The present volume comprises a translation of the aforementioned German edition of transcripts from Hegel's first lecture course on the philosophy of history from the winter semester of 1822-3, but also sensibly includes a new translation of the autograph manuscripts of the two different introductions already mentioned (based on the texts from vol. 19 of Hegel's Gesammelte Werke, edited by Walter Jaeschke, Meiner 1995). In this English edition the surviving manuscripts constitute about 60 pages, while the edited transcripts amount to nearly 400. A second volume will eventually present a translation of transcripts from the last course of 1830-31, along with selections from other transcripts representing later stages of Hegel's lectures on this subject, once the labor on the new German edition of the relevant sources has advanced sufficiently.

All of the contributions to this important series of translations have been attractively produced and very well presented, including informative editorial introductions, helpful textual and explanatory notes, bibliographies of the sources that Hegel himself cited or drew upon, detailed name and subject indexes, German-English glossaries, and marginal references to the relevant German editions. In addition, this particular volume has taken a useful leaf from the Meiner study editions and included a bibliography of German, French and English titles that deal amongst other things with Hegel's philosophy of history. (This bibliography, which tends to privilege theologically oriented readings, should certainly have been extended to include other recent contributions such as Joseph McCarney's Hegel on History, Routledge 2000, Christophe Bouton's Le procès de l'histoire. Fondements et postérité de l'idéalisme historique de Hegel, Vrin 2004, Hegel and History, edited by Will Dudley, Suny 2009, and Marcello Monaldi's Hegel e la storia. Nuove prospettive e vecchie questioni, Guida 2000). The editors also provide a detailed 'Analytical Summary' of all the texts translated here (although it may be feared that students may simply read this instead of the sometimes jagged texts that follow).

In this and earlier volumes Peter Hodgson and his collaborators have in many ways set new standards of clarity and consistency in the presentation and translation of Hegel's writings and lectures, dispensing with 'the Notion' in favour of 'the concept' and eliminating the older practice of arbitrary capitalization, and so on. Thus the present edition provides an excellent starting point for the serious study of Hegel's unfolding concept of 'philosophical' history in his Berlin period. If a lack of literary elegance sometimes makes itself felt in the translation, we must bear in mind that the text reproduced here is precisely not the kind of rounded and finished book that Gans and Karl Hegel had expressly striven to produce, but Hegel's own sometimes condensed and abbreviated manuscripts and a reconstructed transcript of the course that Hegel's students attended in 1822-3.

Of course, readers will immediately wonder to what extent they are hearing the ipsissima verba of the philosopher on the basis of such transcripts, and something more needs to be said in this regard. For one thing, we should probably not imagine that Hegel slowly and clearly recited an already fully prepared text that the listeners simply recorded in the manner of a 'dictation' (even if a surviving transcript may sometimes describe itself as such). Contemporary accounts suggest that he used his own text as a basis and, rather intensely and laboriously, freely developed and expanded on it at various points. Gans described Hegel's manuscripts as follows: 'They often only consist of particular words and names, sometimes connected by dashes, obviously to assist the work of memory in the process of teaching, but sometimes longer sentences, developments as long as a page or more.' Gans thus pointed out that the manuscripts did not contain 'the entirety of what was communicated' to the listeners and stressed 'the numerous changes and re-workings' which characterised Hegel's successive lecture courses. And since the surviving transcripts from a particular course of lectures often differ in length, precision, and degree of detail, with sometimes different formulations and turns of phrase and varying levels of abbreviation, it is clear that these materials require considerable editing in the first place.

Since it is impractical to present all the existing transcripts serially and independently, the editors of the German text underlying this translation have compared the available transcripts of the 1822-3 lectures, taken what they consider to be the most extensive and reliable one, and expanded it with certain expressions or passages more fully or only represented in other transcripts from this series of lectures. The English edition here refers the reader to the more detailed discussion that the German editors provide to justify their 'reconstruction', but this means that we are still dealing with an amalgamated text, an 'image of an image', albeit one that purports to be the closest we can now come to Hegel's words.

In recent years, as more of Hegel's previously unpublished texts and manuscripts and many more student transcripts have been edited or re-edited, there has been a growing discussion of the significance of the identifiable differences and divergences that sometimes appear in his treatments of particular parts of his philosophy, whether between published texts like the Encyclopaedia or the Philosophy of Right and his presentation of the same subject matter in his lectures, or between different lecture series from different years. Many of the earliest editors of Hegel, it has been argued, were so convinced of the unity and finality of 'the system' that they were insufficiently attentive to or interested in such differences and internal developments, and thus presented an overly monolithic picture of Hegel's thought embalmed in the Werke.

Whatever the truth of this claim, there is no doubt that the modern editing and publication of Hegel's surviving manuscripts and of the many lecture transcripts that have come to light has immeasurably enhanced our understanding of his thought in all phases of its development. Thus the critical edition of the lectures on the philosophy of religion has become indispensable to serious students of Hegel, revealing how ready he was to reorganize his material, to try out different introductions, to emphasize particular aspects in the light of contemporary cultural and political developments. It is unlikely that any more Hegel manuscripts will be discovered, but as far as transcripts are concerned 'fresh waters are ever flowing in upon us', and it may be interesting to compare the text presented here with that of the final lectures on the philosophy of history that Hegel delivered in 1830-31 once the sources are edited. But it should be recognized that the old editions of Gans and Karl Hegel still retain a certain significance since a body of manuscript and transcript material available to them has since disappeared, since they are indeed 'readable', since it is not obvious that they radically distort the key features of Hegel's thought, and since these were the books that Hegel's greatest critics such as Marx, Kierkegaard and Nietzsche knew or consulted.

In a sense, the editors here are justified in saying in the Preface that their book represents 'an entirely new version' of Hegel's philosophy of history which thereby 'becomes more accessible than in the past'. But in the last analysis most of the old and many of the new problems associated with this controversial work remain largely impervious to such textual and editorial changes and revisions. The editors may also be right, in a sense, in claiming that to give Hegel's own publications 'a definitive priority over his spoken lectures . . . is to treat his philosophy as a closed book' so that it 'ceases to be a living process and becomes a system' (p. 10). Yet there is clearly a problem here if, as Hegel famously said elsewhere, 'the true shape in which truth exists can only be the scientific system of the same.' This real or apparent tension between system and history -- or the difficult conception of 'system as history', as Otto Pöggeler has described it -- is the real challenge of Hegelian philosophy itself.

The idea of an 'open dialectic', which is what the editors wish to endorse, needs to be brought into coherent relationship with the alleged 'necessity' of the complete array of immanent conceptual determinations that Hegel claims to exhibit in the system proper. And this is ultimately nothing but the old question of 'transition' between 'Logic' and Realphilosophie and the 'correspondence' between conceptual categories and their 'realisation' or exemplification in the field of actual experience. After all the impressive critical-philological work on the sources, the real critical -- i.e., philosophical -- work on the contemporary import of Hegel's thought, and his ambivalent justification of 'the modern age', still remains to be done. We must be grateful to the editors and translators involved in this and earlier contributions to the presentation of Hegel's lectures that they have provided a richer material basis for the engagement with this task.