Legally Poisoned: How the Law Puts Us at Risk from Toxicants

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Carl F. Cranor, Legally Poisoned: How the Law Puts Us at Risk from Toxicants, Harvard University Press, 2011, 315pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780674049703.

Reviewed by Kristin Shrader-Frechette, University of Notre Dame


All of us are awash in about 80,000 industrial chemicals that are often toxic. We are exposed to dangerous perfluorinated compounds from our non-stick frying pans, to phthalates from plastic water containers, to brominated flame-retardants from baby car seats. The result? We are experiencing higher rates of developmental, neurological, immunological, reproductive, hormonal, and carcinogenic impairments and diseases. Roughly 600,000 Americans die each year from cancer, and the US Office of Technology Assessment warns that up to 90 percent of cancers are environmentally induced and thus theoretically preventable.

Why are such harms allowed? As Carl Cranor's title explains, we are "legally poisoned" because no public-health law requires product testing of most chemical compounds before they come on the market. Only later, if the products are judged dangerous, or if there is a "body count," only then does government forcibly remove or reduce the products -- after they have already done harm.

Cranor's volume explains how and why we all are legally poisoned -- and what we can do about it. In a rigorous ethical, scientific, and legal analysis, he details these harms, argues against them, and explains how the legal and regulatory world could be designed to avoid them. The first or introductory chapter begins by surveying the chemical harms to which we are exposed. It provides a wealth of scientific detail, revealing facts such as that newborn babies have more than 200 industrial chemicals in their umbilical-cord blood, and that only about two percent of industrial chemicals have ever been tested for harm. Yet sampling shows that roughly 20 percent of these untested industrial contaminants appear to be mutagenic and therefore carcinogenic. The result? Environmental exposures, as economic externalities, cause US citizens at least $55 billion annually in disease costs.

Chapter 2, "Nowhere to Hide," argues that, given the ubiquity of the tens of thousands of harmful chemicals to which all are exposed, none of us can escape harm from them. They are often long lived, invade our bodies through multiple routes, and frequently cannot be detected without sophisticated equipment. As a result, even those who are vegans and who live near neither toxic dumps nor heavy industry have severe "body burdens" of industrial chemicals.

Focusing on philosophy of science, chapter 3, "Discovering Disease, Dysfunction, and Death by Molecules," investigates key problems associated with making causal inferences about toxic contributions to disease and dysfunction. Subtle scientific studies, typically reliant on sophisticated statistical analyses, clearly document these causes of harms, but laypeople often fail to understand that toxins kill people gradually and not immediately, even when people do not know they are being harmed. Cranor outlines the strengths and limitations of various types of scientific evidence for harms (such as animal versus human-epidemiological studies) and alternative modes of assessing causality. In doing so, he also examines the ways in which special interests manipulate causal data and misrepresent the science -- both of which cause greater harm.

Focusing on ethics and developmental biology, chapter 4, "Caveat Parens: A Nation at Risk from Contaminants," explains how and why developing children are most susceptible to disease, dysfunction, and death from environmental toxins. Most industrial contaminants cross the placenta, contaminate breast milk, and thus affect the fetus who is tens of times more sensitive to the toxins than are adults. Indeed, the chapter shows that much later disease and death is a result of developmental programming, in-utero exposures that are "time-bombs," controlling the later onset of environmentally-induced injury and death.

Chapter 5, "Reckless Nation: How Existing Laws Fail to Protect Children," explains deficiencies in US regulatory law. Cranor shows that, although children are not allowed to be test subjects for medical, pharmaceutical, or pesticide experiments, US law effectively makes them test subjects for commercial chemicals. Why? US law, unlike European Union law, requires almost no product testing. Instead, US law presupposes that industrial contaminants are innocent until proven guilty, and it requires virtually no testing.

Addressing science, ethics, and the law, chapter 6 offers "A More Prudent Approach to Reduce Toxic Invasions." It argues for pre-manufacturing testing of commercial chemicals, for scientific-research protocols that pay special attention to vulnerable subpopulations, such as children, and for risk assessments of cumulative and additive effects of the tens of thousands of chemicals to which we are exposed. After all, current testing -- limited as it is -- assesses only one chemical at a time, regardless of the dynamic and synergistic effects of many combined chemical exposures.

Chapter 7, "What Kind of World Do We Want to Create?" emphasizes the fundamental ethical issues involved in our being "legally poisoned." It argues that premarket testing, with scientific assessment of both synergistic chemical effects and harms to sensitive subpopulations, would improve the quality of life for everyone. It would reduce not only externalities, but also much disease, dysfunction, and death. It would save not only on health-care costs for consumers, but also on public-health costs borne by taxpayers. It might increase costs of very dangerous products, but at least these increased costs would reflect a more accurate price of the harm they cause.

Cranor's book is one of the best contemporary analyses of the ethical, legal, and regulatory harms posed by failed chemical-product testing. Along with the Bending Science volume, by well-known attorneys Tom McGarity and Wendy Wagner, also published by Harvard University Press (2008) -- and along with the ground-breaking book by epidemiologist David Michaels, Doubt Is Their Product, published by Oxford University Press (2008) -- Cranor's book is destined to become a classic. It is a must-read for scholars in philosophy of law, philosophy of epidemiology, practical ethics, and ethics of public health. All policy makers in the legal and regulatory arena should be required to read it. More importantly, it is a must-read for every person who wonders why her family members are being destroyed prematurely by disease and death, even though they eat right, exercise, and see the best doctors.

Why is Cranor's book so good? For one thing, very few philosophers have both distinguished careers and publications in ethical (Kantian) theory, plus a scientific and mathematical background, plus education at one of the nation's most distinguished law schools. Cranor has all three -- a feat accomplished by few scholars, and one that explains why most ethicists could not begin to write Legally Poisoned. Partly as a result, the book is full of abundant, up-to-date documentation for scientific and legal points -- perhaps because Cranor so often does grants and papers with scientist co-authors. Yet another strength of the book is its detailed analyses of the assets and limitations of scientific tools such as statistical assessments in epidemiology. Cranor also deserves praise for the clear outline of research ethics and ethics of human-subject testing, and for pointing out the ways in which law about human-subjects research appears inconsistent with the regulatory vacuum surrounding premarket testing of industrial chemicals. His analysis of how justice, especially in the Rawlsian sense, requires pre-market testing likewise is good.

An important practical strength of the book is that it explains how the European Community, unlike the US, has adopted legislation for the "Registration, Evaluation, Authorisation, and Restriction of Chemicals," REACH, that requires pre-market testing of about 30,000 new and existing industrial chemicals. The EU thus says, "no data, no market" to chemical companies, and Cranor shows that the US could adopt the same approach -- if it were not so beholden to special interests. Perhaps the greatest practical strength of the book is that it obviously shows that philosophers can improve our lives. It shows that ethicists, philosophers of science, and philosophers of law have an important role to play not only in scholarship but also in helping to create philosopher kings -- wise and educated regulators.

Does Cranor's book have any flaws? As I read it, I jotted down notes about scientific or ethical aspects of possible shortcomings (such as its possibly failing to discuss epistemological problems with human, as opposed to animal testing) that I thought were not discussed and yet should be discussed. However, as I read through the book, I found that every one of my mental and physical notes was satisfied, later in the volume, with a brilliant, precise, and clear analysis of the respective points. Although I am not qualified to speak about law and philosophy of law, I could find no scientific or ethical shortcomings in the book. It is a masterpiece.

Perhaps my only quibble, a minor one, is that I wish Cranor had expanded the six pages in which he answers only two objections to his well-argued position. These are the objections that we might lose valuable products, and we might face burdensome testing, if premarket testing of industrial chemicals were required. However, there are many more important objections that need to be considered. Indeed, special interests routinely try to convince the public of these objections to premarket testing. Would premarket testing unreasonably reverse the burden of proof in the law and in ethics? Would it harm the entire economy and stifle innovation? Would premarket testing impose greater economic harms than benefits?

These questions are especially important, partly because President Obama has appointed anti-regulatory Harvard attorney Cass Sunstein to direct the US Office of Information and Regulatory Affairs. As a result, Sunstein has apparently convinced Obama not to implement Clean Air Act protections against ozone, recommended by the US Environmental Protection Agency and its independent Science Advisory Board. Yet ozone, largely caused by fossil fuels, has no safe dose, and it is the main culprit responsible for the doubling of the US pediatric asthma population in the last ten years. These victims now number in the tens of millions of children, just in the US. If Sunstein could force Obama to use his "free-market environmentalism" against child victims of ozone, the same arguments could be used against Cranor's attempt to protect child victims of industrial chemicals. The anti-regulatory arguments of Sunstein and others are flawed, but it is not obvious to most people why and how they fail. Cranor might have helped his cause by detailed consideration of such arguments and objections.

Admittedly, answering these other objections would require another book, a different book, and authors need not write what reviewers prefer. This book, as it is, is about as close as one can get to perfect scholarship in this area of ethics, risk, and philosophy of science. It is one that every person, especially every parent, should read. Most of us have children, and all of us need to hear the powerful message about environmental harms to children that Cranor presents. After all, if recent research about "developmental programming" for environmentally-induced disease is right, adults often get a second chance. They frequently take medicines and get well after adult disease and dysfunction. Children, however, have only one chance to develop.