Legitimacy, Justice and Public International Law

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Lukas H. Meyer (ed.), Legitimacy, Justice and Public International Law, Cambridge UP, 2009, 321pp., $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521199490.

Reviewed by Laura Valentini, The Queen's College, Oxford



On the basis of what principles should we determine whether the international legal order is just and/or legitimate? This is undoubtedly a timely question, with significant practical implications. Our answer to it determines, among other things, whether we should abide by current international law, try to reform it, or replace it altogether. Lukas H. Meyer’s collection brings together leading scholars from different disciplines, including political philosophy, International Relations, jurisprudence and legal theory, each addressing one or more aspects of this important question. The essays in this collection range from very theoretical to more applied, and can be broadly divided into three categories:

1. those which discuss the legitimacy of the international legal system, and of various institutions within it - namely, Allen Buchanan’s and Robert Keohane’s, Samantha Besson’s, Simon Caney’s, and Steven R. Ratner’s;

2. those which address the question of international, or global, distributive justice - namely, Daniel Butt’s, Peter Koller’s, and Herlinde Pauer-Studer’s;

3. those which deal with legitimate humanitarian intervention and the use of force across borders — namely, David Miller’s, Matthias Lutz-Bachmann’s, and Arthur Isak Applbaum’s.

Even if the contributions are not all as well integrated as they could be — in particular, the first half of the book struck me as more coherent than the second - the collection as a whole is rich and instructive. Above all, it has the virtue of addressing the question of international justice and legitimacy from an interdisciplinary perspective, encompassing philosophy, IR, and legal theory. Until recently, these different literatures have proceeded separately, when there is in fact a lot that they can learn from one another. Meyer’s collection helps to show why and how.

Since it would be impossible for me to offer a well-developed discussion of the many issues canvassed in each chapter, I will limit myself to commenting on two key philosophical, and inter-related, questions, which the book as a whole tries to answer:

1. How should we conceive of international (global) legitimacy?

2. How does international legitimacy relate to/differ from international (global) justice?

In my discussion, I will draw on insights from a number of different essays (especially from the first half of the book), so as to give readers a sense of what this collection has to offer, especially from a philosophical point of view, and raise a few issues for future discussion.

How should we conceive of international (global) legitimacy?

This question may be asked at both a functional and a substantive level. That is, we may want to know what follows, normatively, from the fact that a particular international institution is legitimate; or we may want to know what standards have to be adopted for such an institution to be legitimate. With respect to the first question, Daniel Butt’s essay helpfully distinguishes between two senses of legitimacy: thin and thick. In Butt’s view “a system of law possesses thin legitimacy insofar as it is morally justifiable for institutional actors coercively to impose its requirements, and thick legitimacy insofar as those subject to the law possess a political obligation to obey the law.” (p. 174)

Different essays within this collection work with either one or the other account of legitimacy. For instance, Buchanan and Keohane appear to use the idea of legitimacy in a thin sense.1 In their view, an institution is (normatively) legitimate "if it has the right to rule - where ruling includes promulgating rules and attempting to secure compliance with them by attaching costs to non-compliance and/or benefits to compliance." (p. 29 original emphasis). This need not entail that the institution’s subjects are always obligated to obey its rules; however, it does mean that the institution deserves to be supported, and perhaps ameliorated. In particular, for Buchanan and Keohane, “Judging an institution to be legitimate focuses critical discourse by signalling that the appropriate objective is to reform it, rather than to reject it outright.” (p. 31) Besson, on the other hand, opts for a thicker, more demanding, idea of legitimacy, according to which when an institution is legitimate its pronouncements should be seen as authoritative. On her view, a legitimate law is one that “bind[s] those to whom it applies.” (p. 60)

Despite their adoption of slightly different concepts of legitimacy, Buchanan and Keohane, Besson, and others, are in broad agreement when it comes to the specific substantive conceptions of international legitimacy they defend (this, in turn, suggests that the distinction between thick and thin legitimacy is mostly a matter of nuance, and perhaps not needed after all). So, when are international rules and institutions legitimate? That is, when do they have the right to rule, and deserve support, if not strict obedience, from those subject to them?

Most authors in this volume agree that actual consent on the part of states (even when these are democratic), by itself, is insufficient to confer legitimacy on international institutions. Instead, they opt for a two-part standard, comprising both substantive and procedural requirements. The substantive requirements typically include respect for some minimal criteria of justice (e.g., basic human rights), while the procedural ones point in the direction of democratic accountability. Although only Besson defends a full-blown conception of pluralistic, de-territorialized, global democracy, other authors are also keen to make room for democratic values within their frameworks. For instance, Buchanan and Keohane emphasize how their “complex standard” of legitimacy accommodates democratic values, such as equal respect for persons and deliberative decision-making even “in the absence of global democracy” (pp. 53-4). Similarly, Caney sees the ability to “provide a fair political framework in which to determine which principles of justice should be adopted [at the global level]” as a necessary (albeit not a sufficient) condition for the legitimacy of international economic institutions. (p. 117)

What to make of this popular two-part standard of international legitimacy? I find the general idea that legitimacy has both substantive and procedural dimensions persuasive. However, the double nature of legitimacy standards immediately raises the question of how substantive and procedural criteria should be balanced against one another in establishing whether a particular institution is legitimate. Say that an international institution respects basic human rights, but it does very poorly in terms of accountability and transparency (which is often the case with many international institutions today). Is such an institution legitimate — i.e., should we broadly support it and perhaps try to reform it — or should we abandon it altogether? My sense is that we should try to address procedural failures by reforming the institution, rather than by dispensing with it altogether. If this is the case, however, it looks like the institution is legitimate (at least on Buchanan and Keohane’s account), and that procedural criteria have less of a role to play than some of our theorists think. More generally, assessing the relative weight of substantive and procedural criteria for legitimacy seems to be an area of debate worthy of consideration.

How does international legitimacy relate to/differ from international (global) justice?

As John Rawls famously said, justice is “the first virtue” of social institutions. If we already have justice, one may ask, what do we need legitimacy for? While some of the essays in this collection, e.g., Koller’s and Pauer-Studer’s, focus exclusively on the question of international (or global) justice, others tackle the issue of the relationship between justice and legitimacy more directly.

Once again, our authors seem to be in agreement. Implicit in the works of Buchanan and Keohane, Butt, and Caney is the idea that while a legitimate institution warrants general support but may still be improved, a just institution is somehow morally perfect. When an institution is just there is no more room for improvement. Legitimacy, then, is portrayed as a “threshold” concept. To be legitimate, an institution “need not be perfectly just … but it must meet some minimal level of justice” (Butt, p. 175). As we have seen, this minimal justice threshold, at the international level, is typically represented by respect for basic human rights.2

But why do we need a lower threshold in the first place? A key reason for this, many of the contributors to this collection seem to think, is the presence of reasonable disagreement about what justice requires at the international level. In Caney’s words,

It is hard to deny that many reasonable and reflective people disagree about which principles of distributive justice, if any, should apply at the global level. Given this it seems unreasonable simply to state that political institutions should be designed to best realise the correct principles of distributive justice. (p. 116; see also Buchanan and Keohane, p. 35, and Besson, pp. 64-5).

In turn, the presence of this reasonable disagreement justifies the inclusion of procedural, democratic, or quasi-democratic, standards in the authors’ criteria of international legitimacy. If, beyond a minimal threshold of justice, what global justice requires is reasonably disputed, a legitimate international system must provide fora and mechanisms for fair confrontation, deliberation and discussion about what global justice requires.

This particular perspective on the relation between justice and legitimacy suggests that while international justice is an “ideal virtue”, international legitimacy is a “non-ideal one”. In an ideal world, where everyone agrees about justice, we would not need to resort to criteria of legitimacy. However, in the real world, where we deeply disagree about justice, legitimacy becomes a salient institutional virtue (see the book’s introduction, pp. 22-3).

Although it is tempting to reach this conclusion about the relationship between justice and legitimacy, I am not persuaded it is correct. It seems plausible to believe that even an ideal theory of justice should not exceed the limits of the circumstances of human existence. If “ought implies can”, a valid (ideal) theory of justice should not contain requirements that are altogether beyond human reach. In Rawls’s words, when designing an ideal theory of justice, we “strive for the best we can attain within the scope the world allows”.3 Does a scenario in which everyone freely agrees about justice fall “within the scope the world allows”? I, for one, think we should be sceptical about this. The extensive and pervasive disagreements about justice we face in the world today seem to be, at least to a large extent, a consequence of our living under free institutions. Full agreement about morality and justice is only possible under oppressive, totalitarian regimes.4 If this is correct, then the only justice we can aspire to achieve is what many authors in this volume call legitimacy. If we can regard reasonable disagreement about justice as a persistent feature of human existence (in the same way in which moderate scarcity and limited altruism are), then we are led to conclude that there is no justice beyond legitimacy. This, I believe, is an interesting possibility which is also deserving of further attention.


The question of what global justice and global legitimacy require is practically salient and theoretically challenging. This collection advances our understanding of this issue through a rich and multi-faceted set of essays. In this review, I could only discuss one of the key theoretical themes of the book, leaving aside some of its more applied contributions. This, however, should not be taken as an indication that these other contributions are not worth reading. Although, as I have indicated earlier, the book is not always optimally integrated, each chapter competently addresses important moral issues arising in the international arena, and the book as a whole provides a valuable contribution to existing literature, and a starting point for future interdisciplinary research.

1 I say “seem” because whether the idea is used in a thick or thin sense depends on what understanding of a “right to rule” Buchanan and Keohane employ. If this right is understood as a Hohfeldian claim-right, with a correlative duty to be obeyed, then their idea of legitimacy is in fact thick. If, on the other hand, it is a Hohfeldian liberty-right (with no correlative duty) then their proposed idea of legitimacy is thin.

2 Although Butt also points out that perhaps more than respect for basic human rights might be necessary.

3 John Rawls, Political Liberalism (New York: Columbia University Press, 1993), p. 88.

4 Rawls, Political Liberalism.