Legitimacy: The Right to Rule in a Wanton World

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Arthur Isak Applbaum, Legitimacy: The Right to Rule in a Wanton World, Harvard University Press, 2019, 294pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780674983465.

Reviewed by David Lefkowitz, University of Richmond


At a minimum, a legitimate government enjoys a moral right to rule its citizens. This seemingly simply claim raises a host of complicated questions. How should we understand the idea of a right to rule? What conditions must a government satisfy in order to possess a right to rule, and why does it doing so have this moral implication? Where legitimate governments do not already exist, how may they be founded? Arthur Isak Applbaum offers intriguing and sometimes counter-intuitive answers to each of these questions.

Applbaum maintains that A legitimately governs B "only if A's governance of B realizes and protects B's freedom over time, and this is the case only when A is a free group agent that counts a free B as a constituent member of that group" (74). Applying this general principle to the modern state, we get the following principle of political legitimacy: the government of a nation-state legitimately rules its citizens only if (a) it realizes and protects their freedom over time, (b) the government is a free group agent, and (c) the government counts its citizens as constituent members.

Individual citizens are internally free if they possess the capacities constitutive of agency to an adequate degree. These are the capacity to consider reasons for action, the capacity to choose an act on the basis of that assessment, and the capacity to do the act one has chosen because one has chosen it. Individual citizens are externally free if they enjoy independence as non-domination. To be legitimate, then, a government must ensure that its citizens enjoy those rights and liberties necessary to develop and exercise agency, and protect them from arbitrary interference in their lives.

Furthermore, the government itself must possess these same two properties of being (internally) self-governing and (externally) independent; that is, a group agent that is not subject to domination by any other (group) agent. A free group agent exists in virtue of sufficiently free individuals with the power to consider, will, and act combining in such a way that the group exhibits these same three capacities. The requisite combination can arise as a result of intermeshed aims and plans, representation and impersonation, procedures and organizational structures, or a mixture of all three.

Finally, individual citizens become members of the free group agent that governs them either via consent, or by satisfying the principle of fair play, or because membership is a practical necessity, meaning an indispensable means to a practical commitment that an agent either will not or cannot give up. To be a constituent member of a group agent, individual citizens must play a role in the group's exercise of agency. Thus, in a sense yet to be specified, a legitimate government is one in which citizens are free because they rule themselves. In combination with the earlier claim that legitimate government requires respect for, and the protection of, basic human rights, we have Applbaum's solution to the challenge of reconciling individual freedom with political authority: "when a people is governed by a free group agent constituted by its free citizens, those citizens are as free as they can hope to be" (255).

Though he offers a brief defense of each of the above claims, Applbaum devotes most of his book to tracing out the implications of the free group agent account of political legitimacy. For example, using the actions of the self-appointed National Transitional Council of the Republic of Libya as an example, Applbaum demonstrates the impossibility of an ab ovo legitimate government. There is no way to move instantaneously from a state of nature to a political society governed by a free group agent constituted by free citizens. Rather, the most we can hope for is that government becomes legitimate over time as the processes for constituting a free group agent develop and an increasing number of citizens satisfy one or more of the moral criteria in virtue of which they count as constitutive members of that group agent.

Furthermore, Applbaum argues that in principle it is neither impossible nor impermissible for outside actors to force a people to be free. The latter claim rests on two key premises. The first is that it is possible to treat a political group agent paternalistically without doing the same to its individual members. The second is that, all else equal, the paternalistic treatment of a political group agent is permissible if its capacity for agency is underdeveloped, or if those targeted by the paternalistic intervention do not really constitute a genuine group agent at all. Outside intervention that deposes a tyrant and that helps his terrorized victims develop the complex web of shared aims and plans, representation, and procedures for considering, choosing, and acting that constitute them as a group agent violates neither their right to collective self-governance nor their collective independence, for it is only via the intervention that they come to exist as a free group agent. In the same vein, where a government systematically fails to consider its members' reasons, or to choose on the basis of those reasons, or to act on the basis of those choices, paternalistic interventions that target these defects in group agency are no more objectionable than those that target analogous defects in young children.

In the second half of the book, Applbaum argues that to enjoy a right to rule a democratic government must satisfy principles of liberty, equality, and agency, for only if it does so will that government qualify as a free group agent constituted by free citizens. The liberty principle requires that all citizens have a fully adequate set of basic rights and liberties consistent with an equal set for all. The equality principle requires that all citizens have adequate and equal normative power to choose who exercises the normative powers of governance on their behalf. Finally, the agency principle requires that the government constitute a self-governing group agent responsive to the reasons that apply to its citizens (156).

What follows from these principles? First, constitutional norms that constrain the powers of government do not conflict with the citizenry's collective self-governance if they serve the end of constituting the citizens as a free group agent. By rendering the principles of liberty, equality, and agency more determinate, such norms enhance the citizens' ability to satisfy them. Furthermore, counter-majoritarian practices such as (strong) judicial review of democratic legislation may be justifiable if they best serve the goal of protecting and perfecting the government's status as a free group agent constituted by free citizens. Judges ought to strive to interpret both ordinary and constitutional law as consistent with or contributing to the legitimacy of the government's rule, and where this cannot be done, they should strike it down or effectively nullify it.

Second, while political equality requires that citizens have an equal say on who holds political office, it does not require that they have equal input, or any input at all, on the content of law or policy. Citizens must have a right to some say in how they are governed or else they are denied the opportunity to act as political agents, to exercise their normative power to set their own political ends. Yet the image of the people ruling themselves by employing a majority rule voting procedure to enact specific laws and policies is a mirage. The case for majority rule is much weaker than it seems, there is no solution to the problem of social choice that satisfies reasonable criteria such as transitivity and non-dictatorship, and children, as well as past and future generations, are members of the people who cannot vote. We should not assume, then, that the pursuit of free group agency requires direct democracy.

Instead, legitimate democratic rule requires only that every citizen have a right to an equal vote on who governs, that their vote have fair value, and that the exercise of the vote not subvert the free group agent the citizens constitute. A number of surprising implications follow. For example, where a political society contains a discrete and insular minority, the need to ensure the fair value of every citizen's vote may require that the boundaries of some electoral districts be drawn so that they effectively guarantee that the representatives of those districts are responsive to members of that minority. Absent such outcome-sensitive electoral districts, members of the minority will (continue to) suffer domination by the majority, and so not enjoy the freedom as independence that is a necessary condition for the legitimacy of the state's rule over them.

Third, the requirement that citizens be ruled by a free group agent entails the necessity of legislative independence and sheds a timely light on the threat that secrecy poses to legitimate government. If legislators are to exercise group agency, their deliberation, choosing, and acting cannot be limited to means to specific ends but must also extend to the question of which ends to pursue. It follows that they have no moral obligation to pursue whatever ends their constituents think best, since to take such an approach to performing their office would be to deny the government any independent agency. Rather, they ought to exercise the legal powers that attach to their offices by voting for what they believe to be just law. As long as the resulting legislation is consistent with the principle of liberty, and the legislators hold their office as a result of an electoral process that is consistent with the principle of equality, they treat those they rule as free individuals who collectively constitute a free group agent.

Where government is characterized by the separation of powers, legislative and judicial oversight of the executive makes a critical contribution to upholding the connection between what the government decides to do and what it actually does. Where executive officials refuse to provide legislators or judges with information about how they are exercising the powers of their office, or worse yet, lie about it, they undermine the government's capacity to act as a unified group agent. Or put another way, when government officials exhibit insufficient fidelity to the rule of law, citizens suffer domination at the hands of rulers who act capriciously or arbitrarily.

A government that qualifies as a free group agent constituted by its citizens enjoys a moral right to rule them. Traditionally, this right has been understood as a claim to citizens' obedience to the law. Applbaum demurs. Instead, he argues that we should understand the right to rule as a "moral power to impose and enforce conventional duties and change relevant social facts in ways that change the subject's normative situation" (63). As I understand him, Applbaum maintains that a legitimate government enjoys a moral title to alter its subjects' rights to or against specific forms of treatment, either by private or public actors. A subject of legitimate authority, he maintains, "has no moral immunity against the loss of legal rights and the subsequent detrimental exercise of privileges by others, or the imposition of legal duties and their enforcement . . . [therefore] he cannot justifiably complain that the law is an unauthorized abuse of power" (49). While subjects may sometimes have a moral duty to do that which the law would have them do, e.g., if the content of the law mirrors that of a perfect moral duty, it does not follow necessarily from the legitimacy of a government's rule that its subjects have such a duty.

Initially, Applbaum argues only that we should not rule out the moral power conception of a right to rule, and asserts that this is precisely what some theorists do when they derive the concept of a right to rule from a normative theory of what could justify such a right. I think the latter claim is mistaken. Theorists from Plato onward have characterized the right to rule as a claim to obedience because that is what rulers have asserted, and (allegedly) what many subjects have taken themselves to owe governments they judged to be legitimate. Regardless, Applbaum then argues that the moral power conception of a right to rule enjoys two advantages over the traditional understanding of that right as a claim to obedience to law. First, it better comports with the judgment that civil disobedience can be permissible even in a legitimate state. Second, it accommodates the intuition that subjects of a legitimate state may sometimes commit "trifling" violations of its law, such as driving five miles an hour above the speed limit, without thereby wronging their fellow citizens. In both cases, actors have no independent moral reason to conform to the law; indeed, in the case of civil disobedience they may even have a moral duty to violate it. Yet some may also believe (and all should believe) that if the state attempts to enforce the law against them, these actors ought to acquiesce to their treatment, for instance, by paying the fine the state imposes on them. How can we account for these judgments? By recognizing that the state acts within its rights when it enacts a law that constrains our liberty (e.g., to drive faster than 35 mph on a certain road) and then seeks to enforce that law, even in a range of cases where we have no moral duty to act as the law directs.

I am not yet convinced. Why not construe the duty correlative to a right to rule as disjunctive: either obey the law or engage in a (suitably constrained) act of civil disobedience? Or alternatively, why not think that whatever they may claim, legal officials enjoy only piecemeal authority, with justifiable civil disobedience and trifling violations of traffic laws but two examples of instances where they do not? Absent responses to these questions, it is not clear that "compared with the standard alternatives, the power-liability view . . . makes better sense of the complicated judgments responsible citizens make when they confront legal demands that are either tragic or trifling" (44).

Furthermore, I remain puzzled as to how a citizen ought to integrate legitimate law into her deliberations. For example, what should she make of the fact that an agent with a right to rule her has made it illegal to do X? If legitimate rule consists in a right to attach specific costs to certain types of conduct, or to preclude public or private actors from attaching specific costs to certain types of conduct, then it seems that the illegality of X-ing simply provides our citizen with a prudential reason not to do it. Applbaum rightly points out that if the content of the law mirrors the content of morality, then a citizen is not permitted either to act in conformity with the law or to act contrary to it and pay the price the government imposes. But that observation does not speak to the reason the illegality of X-ing provides citizens. It seems to me that on Applbaum's account of political legitimacy rulers address their subjects as prudential agents, not moral ones. A legitimate government is one that has a moral title to shape its subjects' conduct by providing them with incentives to engage, or to forbear from engaging, in specific forms of conduct. I find it difficult to reconcile this picture of legitimate authority with the respect for moral agency central to Applbaum's substantive account of political legitimacy.

Applbaum's primary foil in this book is not the views of other theorists but instead the consensual pedigree folk theory of political legitimacy, which holds that the right to rule is grounded in the consent of individuals who contract to institute procedures of governance by majority rule. While this occasionally leads Applbaum to defend conclusions few scholars would dispute, more often the result is an enlightening examination of legitimate rule that encompasses aspects of political practice rarely addressed by philosophical work on this subject.