Legitimizing Scientific Knowledge: An Introduction to Steve Fuller's Social Epistemology

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Francis Remedios, Legitimizing Scientific Knowledge: An Introduction to Steve Fuller's Social Epistemology, Lexington Books, 2003, 153pp, $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 0739106678

Reviewed by Thomas Uebel, University of Manchester


This book provides an "examination" (1) of Steve Fuller's "social epistemology". Comparing it also to some of the other programmes pursued under this name, it provides a useful service for readers seeking to cross a philosophical terrain made especially treacherous by the fact that most of the competing programmes are pronouncedly controversial, given the perspective of standard analytic epistemology.

Following a Foreword by Fuller himself, the Introduction helpfully encapsulates the subsequent discussions by way of an overview. Chapters 1-3 set Fuller's project in context, chapters 4-6 discuss it in detail. Chapter 1 reads Fuller's response to what he calls the legitimation project in the context of naturalistic epistemology; chapter 2 discusses the interest-oriented epistemology of the Strong Programme and Fuller's own stance on relativism; chapter 3 provides a discussion of the politically oriented epistemologies of Rouse and Fuller. Chapter 4 investigates the conception of normativity that Fuller thinks applicable to science and science policy, and chapter 5 elaborates the accountability conditions there, while the closing chapter 6 contrasts Fuller's project with truth-oriented epistemologies and draws some overall morals.

Yet despite its title this is not a book only for those who still care whether Fuller's social epistemology project is coherent. While considerable effort is expended on this issue, Remedios also treats readers to interesting discussions of the fields of natural and social epistemology in their greater compass. Ultimately, however, this book is dedicated to what the author calls a "qualified defense" of Fuller's project (1). Thus it must be said right away that Remedios' examination of Fuller's views is less critical and considerably more accommodating than Fuller's calling it a "thorough, challenging, yet sympathetic account" (vii) might lead one to expect. Even so, while Remedios does not challenge the contentious assumption that lies at the heart of Fuller's theory, his reconstruction of it at least allows it to come clearly to the fore in further discussion. In this sense, his Introduction throws welcome light on murky issues, despite the fact that, to this reader's mind, the defense does not succeed. Moreover, in the course of his discussions Remedios casts interesting sidelights on naturalistic and social epistemologies further afield. That noted, however, this review will concentrate on his attempted defense of Fuller.

The framework of the book is outlined in the Introduction and further elaborated in Chapter 1. "Kuhn's questioning of legitimation has become a central problem for discussion in the philosophy of science. The question that arises from Kuhn's work is: What legitimizes scientific knowledge claims if science does not have a method to yield truth?" (2) Needless to say, this is a tendentious way of putting matters: what is meant by "if science does not have a method to yield truth"? Unobjectionable if it were to indicate the mere fallibilism of knowledge claims, discussable if it were to suggest instrumentalist anti-realism towards theoretical entities, interpretations become highly problematical when they deny the applicability of epistemological standards to the cognitive efforts of scientists. And just that, it turns out, appears to be meant by the legitimation problem in Remedios' and Fuller's hands, as we shall see.

Readers familiar with some of the rhetorical ploys in the literature of social constructivism may fear that that the author seeks to garner agreement to the legitimation project on account of its most uncontroversial reading only to turn it into a platform for something considerably more radical. But from fallibilism alone or even from anti-foundationalism, social constructivism does not follow, nor does it answer the problems of fallibilism or anti-foundationalism. Do we learn later then why we should accept the legitimation problem and under what interpretation? No good reasons are given for it but the interpretation of the project is nevertheless clarified by Chapter 1, starting out as it does with a non sequitur. "If science does not have the right method, a method that would guarantee access to truth, then it does not have privileged authority." (11) That's like saying that unless knowledge entails certainty, any belief is as good as any other. Yet no better argument for taking the radical problematic seriously is ever given. Still, the harmless interpretation apparently was never intended.

Following an invocation of the problem of the criterion to justify the reliance of naturalistic epistemologies on merely hypothetical justification, readers are then treated to a comparison of two types of such epistemologies, Philip Kitcher's "minimal social epistemology" and Fuller's maximal version thereof. The latter is characterized by the rejection of the thesis upheld by the former, namely, that individuals are the primary sources of knowledge. Again it is hard to discern an argument in Remedios' review of Fuller's tu quoque responses to various critics beyond the insistence that "normatively constituted groups" lie behind the "'oversocialized individual who is a microcosm of the entire social order to which she belongs" (18). Instead, things begin to fall into place when Remedios observes that Fuller is not interested in "traditional problems of knowledge such as justified true belief" but rather "in how texts become certified as knowledge" (ibid.) and in "the material embodiment of knowledge" (19).

Is Fuller then interested simply in rational belief acceptance on the collective rather than the individual scale? This would require that these communities of epistemic agents share some independently justified standards, but this issue is not addressed. Instead, issues pertaining to epistemological justification are simply dropped from the discussion. Certainly Remedios' affirmation that Fuller pursues the normative project as a "rational knowledge policy" with the goal of the "self-conscious reorganisation and administration of scientific disciplines for democratically chosen goals" (20) and his defense of Fuller against criticisms that he fails to address epistemological concerns do not allay the worry. That "Fuller's paradigm case of knowledge production is the university" and that he "does not think that it is the job of the social epistemologist to specify epistemic goals" does not answer but evades the very concern for standards that justified knowledge claims (individual or collective) must meet. Thus in Remedios' view too there appears to be indeed no middle ground between the Cartesian epistemology of old and what amounts to Fuller's radical interpretation of the legitimation problem.

Turning to the answer to this legitimation problem, Remedios does a good job of systematizing Fuller's varied pronouncements on social epistemology. Thus we learn that "Of the three components of Fuller's project -- a metatheory of the naturalization of knowledge; an empirical research programme to analyze normative philosophical claims about the growth of knowledge and to simulate historical episodes to detect the presence of epistemic norms; and a knowledge policy concerned with the public accountability of science via the management accounting of science -- the first two are descriptive and the third is normative." (3) Here a philosopher's interest is surely raised, but on the next page we also learn that Fuller's answer to Kuhn's legitimation project consists of, first, a "normative theory of scientific knowledge" which "locates legitimation in ethics and political theory rather than epistemology" and, second, "the deconstruction of Kuhn" as having "stripped normativity from philosophy of science" (4). Now philosophers are bound to be puzzled: just why should one discard talk of epistemological justification and consider scientific procedures in instrumental political terms? (We will disregard Fuller's problematic attack on Kuhn here.)

Remedios is aware that "philosophers may find Fuller's rhetoric of inquiry unsatisfactory, for they may accuse Fuller of changing the subject to sociology and leaving problems of epistemic justification unanswered." His response in Fuller's voice, however, is equally unsatisfactory: "traditional notions of knowledge and justification are contested notions and cannot be assumed to be valid". (7) The paucity of this response should be readily apparent. Calling notions contested does not absolve us from the task of providing defenses of the alternatives put forward. It is no good, therefore, to dismiss demands for explanations of why the replacement of epistemological concerns with political ones should help answer the original problem. And at least part of that problem, in Remedios' own reconstruction of Fuller's programme, is the issue of how epistemic norms are to be grounded by naturalistic epistemologies. But the legitimation problem in its non-radical form so far remains entirely untouched by Fuller's arguments and their explication by Remedios.

Of course, if an alternative account of epistemic standards were forthcoming, Fuller's programme would engage with these non-radical concerns. So let me ask whether in the later chapters Remedios does better. Chapter 2's discussion of the Strong Programme issues in the question whether Fuller's project can avoid the latter's conundrums over relativism. Remedios' response is curious: Fuller is declared not to be a relativist because, (a) even though he is an antirealist with respect to the natural sciences, he is realist towards social science in the sense that "he accepts the 'validity of social constructivist accounts of natural scientific practices'", and because (b) relativism is "not an issue" for him since objective reality isn't either (44). Surely, however, being a realist vis-a-vis social constructivist accounts renders Fuller into a something like consensus theorist of truth or warrant and so hardly refutes the charge of epistemological relativism, and neither does simply not being interested in the issue of objectivism vs. relativism. If anything, the characteristic move of Remedios' defense of Fuller is clearly displayed here. But changing the subject does not answer previous questions, especially when these pertain to the right to retain the label of the subject of old.

Is there any sense in which Fuller may retain the right to call his programme social "epistemology"? This question can be considered in light of the interesting comparison of the social epistemologies of Joseph Rouse and Fuller in Chapter 3. Both are said to share "common ground" due to "Fuller's epistemic eliminativism [sic!] and Rouse's deflation of knowledge" (47). Since Rouse is not our quarry here we will not worry, for instance, about the fact that his "postepistemological conception of science and scientific knowledge" (48) is not properly explained as readers are not given a clear sense of what it means to say that "knowledge is nonrepresentational" (50) (even though Fuller too is said to share this view (57)). More to the point is Remedios' explication of "Fuller's social eliminativism of scientific knowledge" [sic!] along the following lines. First, that for Fuller "knowledge is materially embedded within society", second, that "the social epistemologist must … [make] hypothetical prescriptions about how we 'ought' to organize our cognitive pursuits" (54-5). Remedios stresses that "it is this prescriptive or normative element that marks social epistemology as distinctively epistemological or philosophical" (55). Put in this harmless way the project could be Alvin Goldman's, but this is clearly an artifact of the presentation.

The contentious point is rather that "'scientific knowledge' should be eliminated so that it is not regarded as an object of inquiry distinct from society"; it "should be understood 'epistemically' as the whole of social life". Here, "'epistemically' is not to be defined in terms of propositional knowledge, but in terms of knowledge as a network". Thus "networks of social causation would take the place of folk epistemology" (ibid.). Whatever else these statements may mean, they do seem to indicate that justification of statements in their representational capacity is not an issue for Fuller. The norms with which he is concerned are not epistemologically, but politically grounded. I submit that while this may make the relevant discourse "philosophical" in some fuzzy and as yet undefined sense, it certainly does not make it "epistemological". Just that confusion, of course, is cast into terminological stone by the name which Fuller chose for his entire project. To say by way of explanation or defense like Remedios that "Fuller's view is that to do epistemology has to do with discrepancies between ends and means" (59) is only to compound the confusion further.

Are we going too fast? Might it not be argued that even though the ultimate parameters of the instrumental evaluation of scientific theories and practices are set by political desiderata, there nevertheless remains in place an intermediate realm of epistemological norms by means of which individual token actions or statements are to be evaluated? Let us approach Remedios' discussion of "Fuller's genealogical account of epistemic norms" under this aspect (67). There he states that "Fuller denies that epistemic norms have logical primacy over social norms" (ibid.). Never mind that it is unclear why the priority issue should be raised with regard to these two sets of norms in the first place, this suggests that epistemic norms could be conditioned, as it were, by social, i.e. political norms. But this raises the very concern we just flagged: unless we hear much more detail about how Fuller envisages the interaction of socio-political and epistemic norms, it is not outlandish to fear that epistemological norms are no longer able to safeguard the objectivity of claims justified under their aegis or even their claim to truth. Remedios' reconstruction of Fuller's "sociohistorical account of how epistemic norms developed" (68) is strong on social construction and contingency but utterly silent on how they further what are sometimes called epistemic virtues: consistency, empirical robustness, predictive ability, even truth. I fear that these virtues are simply retired alongside other aspects of what Remedios and Fuller dismiss as "folk epistemology".

As far as I can see, nothing in Remedios' subsequent discussion of Fuller's embrace of the notion of knowledge policy or in his criticism of specific proposals of Fuller's for the governance of science addresses this concern, nor anything in Chapter 5. Consider: "Fuller argues that the community sets the goals of science, and that the community then defines success by measuring how science achieves those community-set goals." (85) Quite apart from the unrealistic communitarian romanticism in evidence here, no indication is given of how these socially set norms would further the epistemic virtues mentioned above, or even of how Fuller's four "accountability conditions" for science-policy pronouncements would further them. Instead, Remedios reaffirms that Fuller's notion of social epistemology is one "of a nonepistemic [sic!] political social epistemology" (99).

It is prima facie all the more puzzling therefore why Remedios should claim in this final chapter that Fuller's "pragmatic justification of a social theory of science by ethics and politics is successful where others are not, because his solution is nonepistemically normative. He does not use science to justify science; instead he uses norms to justify science." (105) Given that traditional epistemic virtues are not what this theory worries about, how can Remedios claim that it solves the problem of epistemic norms in naturalistic epistemologies? On this point Fuller appears to be as blind as his interpreter. In response to Alvin Goldman's charge that "Fuller and other veriphobes bracket truth and falsity in their discussions of knowledge and end up talking about belief or institutional belief", Remedios notes: "Fuller does not hold to the importance of the truth condition in helping to explain the acceptance of an epistemic practice. Fuller also notes that truth plays no role in terms of his advice about improving an epistemic practice" (109). Since the other epistemic virtues remain equally unappealed to as well, the conclusion is clear. Whatever else it is, Fuller's programme is an epistemological one only in name.

Remedios' Introduction has done epistemologists a real favour. By systematizing the numerous pronouncements on epistemological matters to be found in Fuller's widely spread oeuvre and attempting a defense of his project on this basis, the foundations of Fuller's so-called social epistemology are exhibited clearly as never before. To be sure, it goes against Remedios' intentions that on still closer inspection these foundations should be revealed as incapable of supporting Fuller's claims to have overcome the claim of representation-centred epistemologies to philosophical attention and to have replaced it with his own project. Even so, it remains his merit to have advanced the discussion of Fuller's "social epistemology" to this stage.