Leibniz: An Intellectual Biography

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Maria Rosa Antognazza, Leibniz: An Intellectual Biography, Cambridge University Press, 2009, 623pp., $39.95 (hbk), ISBN 9780521806190.

Reviewed by Gregory Brown, University of Houston


In this remarkable book (hereafter, Leibniz), Maria Rosa Antognazza has set herself a truly herculean task: to provide a unifying narrative of Leibniz's life and works. The task is daunting because Leibniz's theoretical and practical projects were unprecedented in scope, covering vast areas of human endeavor:

From philosophy and mathematics narrowly construed they extended across the encyclopedia of the sciences and beyond: to astronomy, physics, chemistry, and geology; to botany, psychology, medicine, and natural history; to jurisprudence, ethics, and political philosophy; to history and antiquities, German, European and Chinese languages; to linguistics, etymology, philology, and poetry; to theology both natural and revealed; and beyond contemplative pursuits altogether a wide range of practical affairs: from legal reform to the reunification of the churches, from diplomacy and practical politics to institutional reform, technological improvement, and the organization of scientific societies, libraries, and the book trade. [Leibniz, p. 2]

Given the enormous variety of his interests and pursuits, the uninitiated might be tempted to think that Leibniz must have been a mere dabbler, a jack-of-all-trades, master of none. But the remarkable fact is that Leibniz worked at the cutting edge in all of these fields, and made profound contributions to nearly all of them. It is the depth and breadth of Leibniz's projects that makes his intellectual biography so challenging, and although I have some misgivings about her methodological approach, it is a tribute to Antognazza that she succeeds so well in telling the complex and fascinating story of the life and work of this frenetic genius. A glance at Antognazza's bibliography reveals the astonishing list of primary and secondary sources -- in Latin, French, German, and Italian -- that she has managed to pull together in constructing her narrative; the result is a scholarly tour de force. This new biography will be especially welcome to English readers, who have hitherto had to rely almost exclusively on the biography by E. J. Aiton, which was published in 1985. Aiton's biography is a valuable adjunct to the classic biography (in German) by Gottschalk Eduard Guhrauer, but it is focused rather narrowly on tracing the developments of Leibniz's work in mathematics and physics. Updating Guhrauer and surpassing the range of Aiton, Antognazza's biography strives to be a comprehensive, integrative biography, covering the full range of Leibniz's life and work. Antognazza includes a very helpful comprehensive chronological table of Leibniz's life and works at the beginning of the book.

In her introduction, Antognazza explains that she does "not dwell long on the exposition of well-known texts and doctrines," noting that "there is already a large and admirable literature to which the reader can turn for illumination on these matters." She explains her approach as one "which subordinates systematic exposition to the narrative of intellectual development firmly within its evolving local, imperial, European, and occasionally even global contexts" (Leibniz, p. 11). What this means is that this is not a book to consult for a detailed analysis of Leibniz's technical works, or for a critical review of the technical, secondary literature on the various aspects of Leibniz's thought. Rather, Antognazza introduces Leibniz's thought in broad, descriptive strokes, attempting to discern the rough outlines of its development in response to a changing variety of social, political, cultural, and intellectual stimuli, while at the same time attempting to define a narrative theme that will give some sense of order and unity of purpose to Leibniz's multifarious activities.

Antognazza notes that in his "Éloge" of Leibniz, written at the end of 1717 for the Académie Royale des Sciences in his office as secretary, Fontenelle despaired of presenting a chronological account of Leibniz's works, since they appeared far too diverse to admit of any thematic integration. Fontenelle sought, therefore, to conquer Leibniz by dividing him, treating his achievements in philosophy and the various sciences as the result of independent threads spun by a powerful but erratic mind. Setting herself against this approach, Antognazza declares that "the general purpose of this book . . . is to stitch back together the man dismembered by Fontenelle and his successors by emphasizing the organic development of a generally harmonious system of thought and action within a particular historical context" (Leibniz, p. 10). The thread she finds to accomplish this stitching together is a comprehensive project that surfaces and resurfaces under various descriptions at different periods of Leibniz's career, a project motivated by

a dream of recalling the multiplicity of human knowledge to a logical, metaphysical and pedagogical unity, centred on the theistic vision of the Christian tradition and aimed at the common good. This project was formulated in a series of texts which outlined his comprehensive plan to reform and improve the whole encyclopaedia of the sciences. In his youth this project was conceived as the plan of the Demonstrationes Catholicae ("Catholic Demonstrations"); later it was reformulated as a Scientia Generalis ("General Science"), to be expounded in a "demonstrative" encyclopaedia; and finally, in his very last years, it was restated as the Élements de la philosophie générale et de la théologie naturelle ("Elements of General Philosophy and Natural Theology"). [Leibniz, p. 6]

Antognazza's contention is that "[i]f read in the light of Leibniz's all-embracing plan, many of the fragments and drafts of his Nachlaß take on a surprisingly coherent shape, and many of his more concrete efforts at political engagement of institutional reform can also be related to a cluster of core principles and objectives" (Leibniz, p. 6).

As might have been predicted, even for a genius of Leibniz's caliber, his incredibly ambitious project was left still uncompleted at the time of his death, but a plan for what at the time he was referring to as the Demonstrationes Catholicae was drawn up in the early months of 1668, which, as a whole, "was a first draft of a systematic encyclopaedia of the sciences" (Leibniz, p. 90). Leibniz had only completed his formal education in February 1667 with a doctorate in law from the University of Altdorf, thus prompting Antognazza's judgment that by that early date "Leibniz's vision had been born" (Leibniz, p. 66) -- a vision "to achieve a universal synthesis for the glory of God and the happiness of mankind," a "synthesis [that] would be designed to restore unity in multiplicity, unveiling the universal harmony which, despite apparently unbridgeable divisions, governed reality at both the metaphysical and epistemological level" (Leibniz, pp. 66-67). This judgment concerning the early date at which Leibniz's vision had been born seems to accord with one of the "underlying theses" that Antognazza puts forward in her introduction as forming the basis of her biographical approach, namely, "that the most basic of [the] unifying principles and aspirations [that shaped Leibniz's life and work] were established remarkably early and that the outlines of Leibniz's life and thought emerged organically from them." She adds that "[a]lthough by no means discounting the importance of his mature philosophy, this approach emphasizes that the seeds of that philosophy were planted in his youth," and that in "a manner reminiscent of his monads, it almost seems as if the most basic features of Leibniz's intellectual system were implicit from the beginning" (Leibniz, p. 9). But these last two statements go considerably beyond the rather innocuous claim that Leibniz had from beginning to end a "dream of recalling the multiplicity of human knowledge to a logical, metaphysical and pedagogical unity, centred on the theistic vision of the Christian tradition and aimed at the common good." Based on the textual evidence, the latter claim seems perfectly justified; and it is a claim that explains at least part of what Antognazza wants to explain, namely, why Leibniz had his finger in so many pies -- both theoretical and practical -- for almost every conceivable pie was gobbled up in Leibniz's expansive vision. What it doesn't help to explain, however, are the particular forms into which the various aspects of Leibniz's system developed -- and it remains perfectly conceivable that Leibniz fleshed out various aspects, even the basic aspects, of his system in quite different, even contradictory ways at different points in his career. But this is just the kind of view that Antognazza seems determined to forestall when she claims that "the seeds of [Leibniz's] philosophy were planted in his youth," or that "it almost seems as if the most basic features of Leibniz's intellectual system were implicit from the beginning."

As they stand, Antognazza's claims here are extremely vague and hedging; so although I find Antognazza's biography a monumental scholarly feat, I am not entirely convinced of the soundness of her methodological approach. What are "the most basic features of Leibniz's intellectual system"? These are nowhere clearly and systematically set out. How does one recognize a "seed" of Leibniz's philosophy, that is, how does one recognize that some earlier but superseded feature of his system has some later feature of his system "implicit" within it? What does it mean to say that "it almost seems as if" these features "were implicit from the beginning"? Is this latter claim actually intended to be as weak and hedging as it sounds? If not, how strong is the claim? One might defend Antognazza's approach for its being at least more modest than those of other commentators who have claimed to find many of the features of Leibniz's mature system to be full-fledged in his very early works.[1] But for all its apparent modesty, I think that Antognazza's approach is actually less helpful for the purpose of furthering Leibniz scholarship, since vague and hedging claims are difficult to interpret and evaluate.

Consider, for example, Antognazza's discussion of Leibniz's letter of 21 May 1671 to Duke Johann Friedrich, and the enclosed essay, De Usu et Necessitate Demonstrationum Immortalitatis Animae. In these works (see G. W. Leibniz: Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe, ed. Deutsche Akademie der Wissenschaften, Series II, Vol. 1 (Darmstadt, Leipzig, Berlin: Akademie Verlag, 2006), pp. 175-176, 183-185), Leibniz postulated the existence of a certain "kernel of substance," or "self-diffusing seminal center," in all bodies -- whether of humans, plants, or minerals -- consisting of a "physical point" conceived as the "proximate instrument and as the vehicle of the soul constituted in a mathematical point." This kernel was conceived to persist through and explain changes in the gross matter of a body, and Leibniz thought its existence was manifest "from the regeneration of plants from seeds (from that at least, which is not controversial), from the plastic force of seeds in utero, [and] from the essences of the chemists." Ignoring the "physical point" that Leibniz supposed was the instrument, or vehicle, of the soul, Antognazza writes that "Leibniz seemed therefore to be interpreting the essence of bodies as consisting in a spiritual principle of which "flesh and bones" were mere phenomenical [sic] manifestations." She interprets Leibniz as holding here that what "all bodies really are beyond their changing physical appearance [are] beings which result from an indestructible spiritual principle," and then concludes straightaway that "the young Leibniz was already inching his way toward the theory of monads of his mature metaphysics" (Leibniz, p. 113).

But how is this claim to be assessed? We are never explicitly told which features of Leibniz's view in the works under discussion are supposed to represent an "inching" toward "the theory of monads," nor, for that matter, are we told exactly what the theory of monads is supposed to involve. Perhaps the suggestion is that bodies are "mere phenomenal" representations of a quite different, underlying non-extended and incorporeal reality. But the use of the term 'phenomenal' is Antognazza's, and it is not to be found in the texts under discussion; there is no indication in those texts that Leibniz believed that the bodies he was discussing there were "mere phenomenal manifestations" of masses of infinitely many non-extended, perceiving simple substances rather than actually extended corporeal substances. Nor is there any indication there that Leibniz thought that only simple substances were genuine substances. Quite the contrary. Nor is there any hint of the doctrine that substances are incapable of causal interaction, or of the doctrine of global pre-established harmony among the perceptions of substances, all of which doctrines are characteristic features of Leibniz's later theory of monads.

If there are vague hints of similarity, they seem to pale in light of the numerous, profound, and clear differences. Leibniz's view in the texts under consideration seem to resemble far more the views of some later Cambridge Platonists, like Ralph Cudworth and his plastic natures, than it does the theory of monads. It appears, that is, to be closer to a view that posits occult qualities to explain the development of biological organisms or the properties of chemical compounds, a view that in other places, early and late, Leibniz rejected in favor of mechanistic explanations. From this perspective, then, it does not appear so much that the young Leibniz was "inching his way toward the theory of monads of his mature metaphysics" as it does that the mature Leibniz was bounding nearly clean away from certain views found in his juvenile metaphysics.

In any event, rather than straining the eye to find vague, impressionistic similarities between early and late doctrines, it seems a more fruitful approach would involve attempting carefully to understand the early and late views on their own terms and in their own contexts, and only then attempting carefully to lay out both the differences (a procedure subtly subverted by the methodological assumption of robust doctrinal continuity) and the similarities in those views, and finally searching for explanations of why Leibniz came to reject or modify his earlier views as time went on. This procedure seems eminently sensible in light of the unsettled state of Leibniz scholarship. No clear consensus has emerged as to how Leibniz's early, middle, or late metaphysics is to be understood. Antognazza herself acknowledges, for example, that "one of the most debated issues in contemporary literature is whether the doctrine of corporeal substances characteristic of Leibniz's 'middle years' [roughly from the late 1670s to the mid- or late-1690s] is significantly different from the later monadological theory of substance [a view defended, in various forms, for example, by Daniel Garber[2]] or can be reduced to it [as suggested by Robert Adams, for example[3]]." She adds that on Garber's most recent view (in his forthcoming book on Leibniz's physics and metaphysics), "reading texts of [the middle years] in light of the Monadology prematurely dissolves the world of bodies from which Leibniz began his philosophical investigation into the immaterial world of spiritual substances of his most idealistic later phase" (Leibniz, p. 277n). It is hard, then, to understand why Antognazza does not seek to repudiate Garber's view, given that she herself seems so eager to read the texts of even the very early years in light of the Monadology. Given the scholarly disagreement concerning the relation between Leibniz's middle and late metaphysics, and given that Leibniz's early works have been subjected to far less scholarly scrutiny, and hence are even less well understood than the later texts, it is hard to see how anyone could reasonably assert that in texts as early as 1670 and 1671 Leibniz was "inching his way toward" anything very specific, let alone "already inching his way toward the theory of monads of his mature metaphysics." This is mere hand-waving; the judgment seems not only premature, but devoid of any clear sense.

At times Antognazza appears to be less modest in her quest to find continuity in Leibniz's developing views, joining more adventuresome commentators in suggesting that certain basic principles of Leibniz's mature system are in fact to be found, not only in seed, but fully developed, or nearly so, in his very early works. For example, she notes that in his Confessio Naturae contra Atheistas (spring, 1668), Leibniz defended the conclusion that the origin of the primary qualities of bodies cannot be found in the essence of body, as the Cartesians conceived it, "by bringing into play for the first time [a] principle central to Leibniz's later philosophy but not yet formally stated: the principle of sufficient reason" (Leibniz, p. 103). She goes on to note that the principle appears explicitly stated as nihil sine ratione in a work written a few months later, the Demonstrationum Catholicarum Conspectus, and stated more fully as nihil est sine ratione, seu quicquid est habet rationem sufficientum in a text from 1671 or 1672 (Leibniz, p. 103). Here one is led to believe that a "principle central to Leibniz's later philosophy" is not simply "implicit" in some very early works, but that it is to be found there fully developed.

But the suggestion that in these early texts the principle of sufficient reason is the same principle as that which parades under a similar description in later texts is based, I believe, more on terminological resemblance than on careful analysis. As is well known, in texts from the mid-1680s Leibniz came to adopt his conceptual containment theory of truth, and at the same time he began to formulate the principle of sufficient reason in terms of that theory.[4] Understood in this strong sense, the principle of sufficient reason states that the sufficient reason for any substance's possessing a particular predicate is to be found in the fact that the predicate is contained in the complete individual concept of the substance in question. But a causal determinist, for example, might hold that everything that happens has a sufficient reason, in the sense of having a cause, without supposing that every predicate truly said of a substance must be contained in its concept. That we have two quite different principles parading under the same name seems well enough confirmed by the fact that in the Leibniz-Clarke correspondence, Clarke was perfectly happy to grant Leibniz the principle of sufficient reason only to have Leibniz then complain that Clarke had failed utterly to understand the principle Leibniz had in mind (see Clarke's Third Paper, paragraph 2 and Leibniz's Fifth Paper, paragraph 125). It is not at all clear, then, that the principle of sufficient reason that Leibniz had in mind when he composed his earlier texts should be conflated with the principle of sufficient reason he had in mind when he composed his later texts. In fact, given that Leibniz developed a theory of contingency in the later texts -- the infinite analysis theory of contingency[5] -- which is wholly absent from the earlier texts, and which was specifically addressed to the question of how conceptual containment of predicates, as opposed to mere causal determinism, can be reconciled with contingency and freedom, it seems that the principle enunciated in early texts might have been understood in a very different way from that in which the principle of the same name was understood in later texts.

In addition to the methodological issues I have raised, there is also the occasional oddity or confusion. For example, in her discussion of Leibniz's work relating to the calculus in the 1670s, Antognazza goes to the trouble of reproducing a rather complicated mathematical diagram to illustrate the general "transmutation theorem" that Leibniz discovered in 1673, but without explaining either the details of the transmutation theorem itself or how it is to be understood in terms of the diagram (Leibniz, p. 159). A good editor, I think, would have insisted either that the diagram be explained or that it be eliminated as serving no clear exegetical purpose. A more serious source of confusion arises in connection with Antognazza's discussion of a well-known passage from Leibniz's letter of 20 June 1703 to De Volder, in which he explains the structure of monads, or simple substances, and their relation to corporeal substances. Antognazza suggests that in this passage there is no real conflict between the doctrine of monads and the doctrine of corporeal substances because "corporeal substances were conceived as aggregates of the indissoluble unities of soul and primary matter which Leibniz called monads" (Leibniz, p. 423). But from the middle years on, Leibniz was very careful to distinguish between "aggregates" and "substances," holding that the latter, but not the former, constitute unities per se; so it is very misleading to suggest that in the letter in question Leibniz conceived of corporeal substances as "aggregates." Antognazza seems to recognize this point when she adds that "the difference between corporeal substances and the mere 'Mass [Massa] or secondary matter, or organic machine' (also ultimately resulting from an aggregate of monads) lay in the fact that in corporeal substances a dominating monad provided the principle of unity required by anything in order properly to qualify as a substance" (Leibniz, p. 423). But this only serves to compound the confusion, since to say that corporeal substances differ from aggregates by possessing a principle of unity contradicts the previous claim that corporeal substances were conceived by Leibniz as "aggregates" of monads. But such lapses are few and far between; and despite my very real qualms about Antognazza's methodological approach, I regard her work as a monumental and lasting contribution to Leibniz scholarship, one that will be read by every serious student of Leibniz. Finally, I should say that Cambridge University Press deserves much credit for publishing such a large and specialized book at a price easily within the range of most of those students.

[1] This approach is well represented in Christia Mercer's Leibniz's Metaphysics: Its Origins and Development (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001). See also her essay, "Leibniz and Sleigh on Substantial Unity," in Donald Rutherford and J. A. Cover, eds., Leibniz: Nature and Freedom (New York: Oxford University Press, 2005), pp. 44-68, and the comments in the book reviews by Gregory Brown (in Mind 115 (2006), especially pp. 804-805) and Marleen Rozemond (in The Leibniz Review 15 (2005), especially pp. 155, 158).

[2] For an overview of Garber's evolving interpretations, see Paul Lodge, "Garber's Interpretation of Leibniz on Corporeal Substance in the Middle Years," The Leibniz Review 15 (2005), pp. 1-26.

[3] Robert Adams, Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist (New York: Oxford University Press, 1994), chapters 10-11.

[4] Indeed, as Robert Adams has observed, "in the works of the 1680s and later, Leibniz sometimes proposes a derivation of the Principle of Sufficient Reason from the conceptual containment theory of truth" (Adams, Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist, pp. 68-69).

[5] On which see ibid., pp. 25ff.