Leibniz and China: a Commerce of Light

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Perkins, Franklin, Leibniz and China: a Commerce of Light, Cambridge, 2004, 242 pp, $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521830249.

Reviewed by D. E. Mungello, Baylor University


One of the great unanswered questions surrounding Leibniz’s interest in China has been how central this interest was to his philosophy. Was it merely a fascinating digression sparked by his polyhistorical style? Or did Leibniz’s interpretations of China have an essential connection to his philosophy? For almost eighty years (since 1921), research into Leibniz’s interest in China has been conducted mainly by Sinologists and Leibniz scholars in continental Europe rather than by philosophers of the Anglo-American tradition. The latter, deeply influenced by the seminal works of Betrand Russell (The Philosophy of Leibniz, 1900) and Louis Couturat (Opuscules et fragments inédits de Leibniz, 1903), have regarded Leibniz’s China interests as peripheral to his main philosophical concerns. This new book by Franklin Perkins represents a rebuttal to that point of view. It is an attempt by an American-trained philosopher to show that Leibniz’s interest in China and cultural exchange “is not accidental” and “that Leibniz encourages exchange not in spite of his philosophical system but because of it” (p. 45).

Perkins’ book is the result of new research on Leibniz that has undermined the previously dominant Russell-Couturat line of interpretation and opened new possibilities of interpretation in three ways. First, Leibniz is viewed as more pragmatic and empirical than previously. Secondly, he is seen no longer primarily as a logician, but rather as someone motivated by practical and theological concerns that led him to a concern with cultural exchange. And finally, he is viewed more as a pluralistic thinker than previously and as someone trying to harmonize different schools of thought.

Perkins undertook his research initially as part of a doctoral dissertation in Philosophy at Penn State University completed in 2000. This dissertation “Comparing Reflections: Leibniz’s Theory of Cultural Exchange and his Writings on Chinese Philosophy” was revised and retitled Leibniz and China: a Commerce of Light. The term “commerce of light” was taken from a letter Leibniz wrote to the Jesuit missionary Giovanni Laureati on 12 November 1689 just before the latter’s departure for China. Perkins translates (p. 125) Leibniz advising Laureati: “[I hope] you will remember the great business that has been given to you, promoting commerce between two such widely separated spheres. A commerce, I say, of doctrine and mutual light” [Commercia inquam doctrinae et mutuae lucis]. A complete transcription of Leibniz’s letter to Father Laureati has been published in Leibniz Korrespondiert mit China (Frankfurt am Main: Klostermann, 1990, p. 11). The latter was edited by Dr. Rita Widmaier, who assisted Perkins by guiding him through the Leibniz Archiv in Hannover.

The crux of Perkins’ argument is found in chapter 2, “Order and Diversity in Leibniz’s Metaphysics.” Here Perkins presents the view that Leibniz’s enthusiasm about cultural exchange derives from his application of the principle of sufficient reason to claim that “the universe is utterly ordered, that everything has a place and a reason” (p. 51). The sufficient reason and the source of order is God, from which Perkins derives two conclusions. First, as we come to know this order, we come closer together (diversity is ordered). Secondly, “there must be a sufficient reason for these differences, and it must be an indispensable part of the best possible world that, at least at this time, we have cultural differences and even conflicts” (p. 52).

Although Leibniz supported Christian and trade missions to China, his greater goal was to promote exchange in the form of a “commerce of light.” The missionaries served as mediums for this exchange. Leibniz encouraged the missionaries to learn as much as possible from the Chinese and to publish more information about China, as he tried to do in his collection Novissima Sinica (1697) (p. 126-127). While he saw Europe as superior in the development of deductive . priori knowledge, he thought China excelled in empirical knowledge (p. 135-136). For this reason, while the natural theology of Europe was more developed and articulate, the natural theology of the Chinese was more effective in producing good behavior (p. 152). While Europe’s moral poverty led it to perpetual conflicts and wars between religious factions (in Leibniz’s lifetime), China was peaceful. This led Leibniz to “prefer the natural theology of the Chinese to the corrupted revealed theology of Europe” (p. 154). Leibniz was not attacking Christianity per se, but seeking to improve the situation in Christian Europe through an exchange with China.

Perkins’ book is more synthetic than creative. It develops and elaborates on a connection that a number of scholars have assumed but not demonstrated. It is not based upon the discovery or study of any new documents. Given the thoroughness of Leibniz scholars over the past fifty years, it is unlikely that many undiscovered documents on Leibniz and China exist. All of the materials on which Perkins focuses have been previously identified, studied and translated into English and other modern languages. But Perkins’ philosophical perspective sometimes leads him to conclusions that are misleading. Perkins writes, “the reason Leibniz’s engagement with China appears so surprising and worthy of attention is its contrast with the disinterest of [Leibniz’s] contemporaries” (p. ix). This statement is true only to the extent that it applies to other philosophers like Descartes and Locke. It certainly is not true when applied to Leibniz’s contemporaries as a whole. The great demand in Europe for the mainly Jesuit-authored books on China (most of which Leibniz read) are proof of this interest.

Perkins’ book is clearly written and remarkably free of academic jargon. One criticism involves its neglect of works published on Leibniz and China after 1999. For example, although his bibliography lists the published collection of papers from the 1997 Berlin Symposium, Das Neueste über China (Stuttgart: Steiner, 2000), he does not deal with its contents. In sum, this is a book that seeks to move the study of Leibniz and China forward, after a long hiatus. I hope that Leibniz philosophers in North America will finally engage in substantive debate on the link between Leibniz and China rather than continuing to dismiss Leibniz’s China interest as a peripheral (albeit fascinating) digression from the central concerns of his philosophy.