Leibniz and the Two Sophies: The Philosophical Correspondence

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Lloyd Strickland (ed., tr.), Leibniz and the Two Sophies: The Philosophical Correspondence, Centre for Reformation and Renaissance Studies, 2011, xiv + 468pp., $37.00, ISBN 9780772720863.

Reviewed by Irena Backus, University of Geneva


This is an English translation (very largely from the French) of what the editor has termed philosophical correspondence between Leibniz and his patron, Electress Sophie of Hanover (1630-1714) and the latter's daughter, Queen Sophie Charlotte of Prussia (1668-1705). The entire correspondence between Leibniz and the two women spans some 750 items on a variety of topics, mainly politics and courtly matters. Of these, the vast majority (ca. 600 items) concern Sophie of Hanover, who outlived her daughter and who entertained closer relations with Leibniz not just as philosopher but also as official historian and court advisor. For the present volume Strickland has selected only those letters which bear on what he considers to be philosophy. He has also excerpted paragraphs on philosophy from letters that deal with many other topics. This makes up a small collection of 81 letters or excerpts from letters from the period 1691-1714, as well as nine fragments and three short supplementary texts, pertaining respectively to (1) the prophecies of Rosamund Juliane von der Asseburg, (2) the metaphysics of J. H. von Fleming, and (3) the preface by Leibniz (possibly with the help of F. M. van Helmont) to the second edition of Boethius's Consolation of Philosophy (1696). The correspondence includes topics covered in these fragments and short supplemental texts.

Regarding the second short supplementary text, Fleming claimed that there was a sort of hierarchy of active souls, the inferior ones bearing also passive material bodies, progressing, layer by layer, up to the purely active God. Fleming's theory, which Strickland for some reason finds very complicated (pp. 50-51), was directly at odds with Leibniz's own theory that every single being, e.g., a sheep, was composed of an infinite number of units (which he later called monads) which were more or less spiritual and which were organized by the dominant monad to form the composite substance, be it animal, a thing (such as a stone) or a human. In Leibniz's view there is an infinite series of monads ranging from the completely active to the almost inert. Their proper activity is perception or mirroring of the universe in various degrees of perfection according to their degree of activity or inertia. Every body is a colony of monads with various degrees of activity and the human being is therefore a part of the normal activity of mirroring, albeit much more active or spiritual than, e.g., a stone, which is spiritually practically inert. (Unlike the little-known Fleming, Leibniz denied any communicability between these unities he later called monads, and above all denied a passive role to matter).

Useful background information on historical context of the letters is provided in the editor's introduction, which also contains a rather less lucid account of Leibniz's explanations of his philosophical views to the two noblewomen and a short paragraph on the principles of the present edition. Based as far as possible on the text of the Akademie Ausgabe (AA) of Leibniz's complete works and correspondence (which is still in progress), Strickland's translation is by and large accurate (although overliteral at times: e.g., "demonstrated his worth" instead of "drew attention to himself" for "cest fait valoir", p. 211; "we instead be subject to " instead of "we rather have cause to" for "nous soyons sujets à", p. 213; "assesses inaccessible territory" instead of "measures inaccessible fields of force" for "mesure des champs inaccessibles", p. 218). His careful annotations are helpful in explaining allusions to authors, texts and events in the text of the letters. Where both a draft of the letter and a later version are included, both are reproduced. Similarly, the editor provides in note-form the text of Leibniz's marginal glosses, corrections etc. where he deems the latter to be philosophically relevant. Strickland is particularly to be commended for the information (at the head of each letter) giving exact references to where the original documents are located and references to all the available editions, including volume and page reference to the original text in the AA. Unfortunately, the numbering of the letters (1-81) is his own, and no cross reference is given to the AA numbering. Moreover, he omits to say that, although printed volumes of the AA I series, which contains the letters, still only go up to 1702, the full text of the volumes covering the years 1703 and 1704 is available on the web (as accessed18th July 2011) where it can be viewed at no charge.

Strickland also provides a useful bibliography and summary indexes of persons and subjects at the end of the volume. The edition suffers from three major drawbacks: One is Strickland's decision to include only extracts bearing on philosophy from letters that also deal with other topics. The second is his underlying postulate as voiced in the Introduction that, contrary to the received scholarly opinion, Sophie of Hanover in particular had a greater philosophical flair than has been hitherto thought. The third drawback, which this review will treat together with the second, is his selection of letters which he considers relevant to philosophical topics, but whose connection with philosophy is not always self-evident. Predictably, given the concerns of the period and Leibniz's own, it is sometimes difficult to separate out theological, scientific and philosophical aspects of this correspondence.

The drawback of including only the philosophical matters from letters on a variety of topics is that all too often the full context is helpful in assessing the amount of time and space that either Sophie or Sophie Charlotte were prepared to devote to philosophy. The omissions in the translation are sometimes indicated by "…" and at other times by a brief note to the effect that "several paragraphs of court gossip have been omitted" (p. 218). In fact the amount of material omitted varies from a couple of sentences to several paragraphs. Two examples suffice in a short review.

The first, Strickland's no. 42, pp. 210-211 (AA no. 58), is Sophie's letter to Leibniz where she admits to not having understood Leibniz's concept of individual substances as explained in his letter no. 41. Strickland reproduces this paragraph and the final paragraph of the letter where Sophie talks about the tapeworm that J. G. Eckhart had shown to the court and talks generally about the blessings of good health. Several "items of news and gossip have not been translated" (p. 210 n. 362). On consulting the full text of the letter, we note that what has been omitted are only three sentences, one of them regarding Leibniz's good standing at the Brandenburg court (important because of the religious union negotiations between Hanover and Brandenburg), another about Sophie's sons and the third about the poor state of health of Katharina von Harling. Why omit these non-philosophical paragraphs while retaining the information about the tapeworm and Sophie's musings on the importance of good health?

Conversely, Strickland's no. 62, Leibniz's letter to Sophie Charlotte (17 Nov. 1703, AA no. 396) has been truncated very considerably. Strickland has cut out the paragraphs on spirit communication, the siege of Wolfenbüttel and other military matters retaining only the superficial mention of the French translation of Locke's Essay on Human Understanding which Leibniz was studying. Granted this short extract provides some information about Leibniz's view of Locke, the full text shows that the "court gossip" that has been omitted provides rich and detailed information on the cultural and historical context within which all the protagonists were working, of which philosophy was only one fairly small aspect. Among the omitted items figures the mention of a new edition of Isaac Jacquelot's Dissertations sur l'existence de Dieu, which did not appear until 1744, and discussions between Father Vota and L'Enfant on religious matters, items of as much philosophical interest as Leibniz's fairly cursory mention of Locke's Essay.

This reviewer notes that the major philosophical locus developed in the correspondence is Leibniz's theory of individual substances (monads) which he explains over and over again (esp. pp. 197, 203-205, 210) until Sophie finally politely allows him to understand there are more important concerns than speculating about individual substance (p. 203). The other locus is of course the theodicy, and here Leibniz fares rather better with Sophie Charlotte, who accepts his view once he has presented it as a spiritual injunction to be content with one's lot (pp. 186ff). There is nothing within the correspondence as reproduced here to suggest that Sophie of Hanover's philosophical ability has so far been underestimated by scholars. Against this view Strickland argues (pp. 50-64) that Sophie's lack of understanding of Fleming's theory was purely due to its intrinsic abstruseness and Leibniz's unclear explanation of it. Concerning Leibniz's exposition of the monads (as he later called them), Strickland considers that it was "incompletely" or "misleadingly" stated to her and that she was not alone in not understanding it. Strickland also finds that Sophie's objections to Leibniz's and Molanus's arguments for the immaterial nature of thoughts and the soul show her to have been not an obtuse amateur but an independent-minded thinker who maintained that that which represents is similar in nature to that which it represents. Although Strickland considers this to be a venerable idea grounded in Renaissance tradition which had fallen into disrepute in Sophie's time, he does not name the tradition or go any more deeply on what underpins her ideas on the material nature of thought and the mind.

Thus Strickland's arguments for Sophie's philosophical ability are easily outweighed by the opposite arguments starting with the small number of letters on philosophical topics in relation to the correspondence as a whole (cf. p. 4). We should note here that the first nine items concern the prophecies of Rosamund Juliane von der Asseburg, which awakened far more interest on Sophie's part than individual substances and which Leibniz assigns to the realm of natural phenomena. It is a moot point whether the issue of prophecies is to be categorized under philosophy or under theology and natural science. If we take the latter view, this reduces the number of philosophical items in the correspondence even further. Secondly, Molanus's judgment of Sophie as a philosopher or any sort of abstract thinker (p. 190) is unquestionably damning ("[on the definition of the soul] she did not even respond to my arguments but multiplied questions, as she is in the habit of doing, some of which were irrelevant while others were very easy to answer"). Again, judging by the internal evidence of the correspondence, Sophie never appears to initiate a philosophical discussion with Leibniz and the discussion she initiates with Molanus concerns the soul, which would have been of spiritual or theological concern to her. Moreover, there are few, if any, allusions to the views of other contemporary philosophers in Leibniz's exchanges with the Electress. Significantly, although Strickland does not say so, Leibniz never apparently provided Sophie with extracts from writings of other philosophers in the way he provided her with extracts from von Spee's Güldenes Tugend-Buch (cf. pp. 180-181 and AA VI, 4 no. 430 for the extracts themselves, which Strickland does not mention in his footnote on Spee on p. 180).

In short, while the selection criteria and the presentation of the excerpts and full texts of letters in this volume remain unclear and while Strickland's plea for the recognition of Sophie's philosophical abilities fails to convince, the present volume is far from useless. First and foremost, it makes the reader aware that Leibniz's promulgated his theory of individual substances in courtly circles where it was not understood despite his attempts to put it as simply as possible. The issue of "Leibniz for the (courtly) layperson" might thus merit further investigation. Secondly, if read against their full edition in the AA and elsewhere, the items in this book show both Sophie and her daughter as women of wide cultural interests including spirit communication, prophecies, spirituality and so on. What we term nowadays philosophy, especially Leibniz's philosophy, was only one of those interests and by far not the most central.

http://www.gwlb.de/Leibniz/Leibnizarchiv/Veroeffentlichungen/I21A.pdf (as accessed18th July 2011).

[1] http://www.gwlb.de/Leibniz/Leibnizarchiv/Veroeffentlichungen/I21A.pdf (as accessed on 18th July 2011).