Leibniz: Body, Substance, Monad

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Daniel Garber, Leibniz: Body, Substance, Monad, Oxford UP, 2009, 428pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199566648.

Reviewed by Stephen Puryear, North Carolina State University



To what extent, if any, was Leibniz an idealist, that is, one who holds that all things are ultimately just immaterial minds and their contents? And if he was an idealist, when did he become one? Did he embrace the view as early as the 1680s, around the time he composed the Discourse on Metaphysics (1686) and subsequently discussed his views with Arnauld (1686-87)? Or was it only later, perhaps around the turn of the century, that he came to accept idealism? Such questions have been at the center of debate in Leibniz scholarship for more than two decades, and one of the major players in these debates has been Daniel Garber. Having sketched his influential position in a number of articles over the years, he now gives full expression to his view in this highly anticipated and long-awaited book.

Tradition has it that from the mid-1680s until his death some thirty years later, Leibniz consistently advocated a form of idealism according to which all things are reducible to simple, immaterial substances — variously called monads, minds, souls, entelechies, substantial forms — and their modifications. Garber, however, opposes this tradition in two important respects. First, his central thesis is that during the 1680s and 90s, the period now known as the middle years, Leibniz favored a “corporeal substance metaphysics” that differs markedly from the monadological metaphysics of the later years. The principal difference between the two systems concerns the basic building blocks of the created world, which on the later view are unextended, mind-like monads, and on the earlier view are corporeal substances, understood as quasi-Aristotelian composites of substantial form and matter. Since this earlier metaphysics takes the fundamental beings to be corporeal, Garber concludes that even if Leibniz was an idealist in the later years, he was actually a realist about body during the 1680s and 90s. The second aspect of the traditional interpretation with which Garber takes issue concerns Leibniz’s later views. He argues that the Leibniz of this period, far from being a committed idealist, was constantly thinking and re-thinking his views, struggling to find an acceptable account of the relation between bodies and monads. So much indeed were his views in flux, Garber claims, that it is difficult to judge whether Leibniz was ever really an idealist.

Garber devotes most of the book to the task of explaining how the corporeal substance metaphysics of the middle years developed out of Leibniz’s earliest views on the nature of body. In Chapter 1, he begins his developmental story with an account of these earliest views. He argues that during the late 1660s and most of the 1670s, Leibniz was basically a heretical Hobbesian, one who accepted the standard mechanical philosophy for the purposes of physics, but who supplemented bodies with immaterial minds and, for theological purposes, substantial forms. According to Garber, however, all this would change in the late 1670s, when Leibniz began to realize that substantial forms were required not only for theological purposes but also in order to give an adequate account of the physical world. This radical shift in his thinking, the story goes, would eventually lead to the corporeal substance metaphysics of the middle years.

In the next three chapters Garber explains Leibniz’s reasons for thinking that an adequate account of the physical world must appeal to substantial forms. The first reason, the subject of Chapter 2, is that without such forms we could not explain the unity and persistence of corporeal things. Intuitively, the idea is that a body, which is in itself only an aggregate with a constantly changing composition, could have genuine unity and could survive such changes in its composition only if there were a soul or substantial form to unite its parts. The other reason physics requires substantial forms has to do with force and activity. As Garber explains in Chapters 3 and 4, Leibniz comes to realize that bodies must contain forces, both active and passive. But if bodies are purely material beings, he reasons, then they cannot contain force, since they would have only size, shape, and motion, qualities that are altogether different from force. Bodies must therefore be more than just matter: they must contain something immaterial in which active and passive force can be found. And this something more, Leibniz concludes, can be nothing other than the substantial forms that considerations of unity and persistence also led him to posit.

But why must bodies contain force? According to Garber there are several reasons. First, if bodies did not contain a passive force in virtue of which they resist the motions of other bodies in collisions, then Leibniz’s axiom that the whole cause must be able to perform exactly as much work as the entire effect would be false (102-6). Second, (active) force holds the key to explaining how we can discover the true motions of bodies despite the equivalence of all hypotheses about motion (106-15). Third, bodies have extension only in virtue of containing some essence that is extended as whiteness is extended in milk, and force is the most reasonable candidate for this essence (164). Finally, if matter were pure extension and did not contain force, it would be perfectly homogeneous and thus, given the absence of vacua, would provide no way of discerning any motion or even of distinguishing one body from another (164-66).

In Chapter 5 Garber considers what bearing Leibniz’s distinctive views on causation have on his interpretation. After discussing Leibniz’s non-communication thesis — the doctrine that created substances are strictly speaking incapable of influencing one another — he turns to the account of “ideal action” that Leibniz begins to put forward in the middle years. According to this account, there is an extended sense in which one substance can be said to influence another in virtue of differences in the degree to which their representations (or “expressions”) are distinct. Garber worries that these more or less distinct representations might be most plausibly understood as the internal states of souls or soul-like entities, in which case, he says, Leibniz would appear to be thinking in terms of the monadological metaphysics rather than a corporeal substance metaphysics (207). But he goes on to argue against this understanding of representation. He points out that though for Leibniz perception is always something mental, a state of mind-like or soul-like simple substances, expression or representation is not, since even composite things can express (221-24). Accordingly, when Leibniz declares that substances interact by expressing one another more or less distinctly, as he does in the middle years, this should not be taken to imply that these substances are simple, mind-like entities rather than composites of form and matter.

Next, in Chapter 6, Garber traces the development of Leibniz’s conception of the mechanical philosophy with a view to the role that final causes — roughly, the reasons things are as they are — played in that development. He contends that after repeatedly trying and failing to discover a rigorous demonstration of the equality of cause and effect, and of the laws of motion that follow from this equality, Leibniz concluded that these truths must not be geometrically necessary, as he had previously believed, but instead must be grounded in the divine wisdom, that is, in God’s reasons for making them true. So in effect he came to believe that the principles and laws at the foundation of his physics must ultimately be explained in terms of final causes. At the same time, he came to realize that everything in nature could be explained not only mechanically, in terms of efficient causes, but also in terms of final causes, which can be found both in God and in the corporeal substances that make up the world.

One of the stiffest challenges to Garber’s reading comes from the fact that during the middle years Leibniz appears to endorse a kind of phenomenalism about bodies, that is, the view that bodies are nothing but phenomena or appearances. The problem is that if bodies are just phenomena, then this implies that the basic building blocks of the physical world are not corporeal substances, as Garber has it, but something like souls or monads. According to the argument of Chapter 7, however, the Leibniz of the middle years was not really a phenomenalist in this sense, or for that matter, in any sense that conflicts with his corporeal substance metaphysics. In making the case for this claim, Garber helpfully distinguishes between four kinds of phenomenalism that can be found in the writings of the middle years. The first two, which he calls human-mind phenomenalism and extended-mind phenomenalism, portray bodies as nothing more than the coherent perceptions of minds or the souls of corporeal substances, respectively. These versions of phenomenalism do indeed conflict with the corporeal substance metaphysics, but according to Garber they are not views Leibniz actually endorses. Rather, he mentions them only to give his readers a sense of what the world would be like if realism were false (272-86).

The situation with the third and fourth kinds of phenomenalism is otherwise, because Garber admits that Leibniz does endorse them during the middle period. Unlike the first two kinds of phenomenalism, however, they are not inconsistent with the corporeal substance metaphysics. The third kind, aggregate phenomenalism, is the view that aggregates derive their unity and being from the activity of created minds (295-96). On Leibniz’s view, though, an aggregate is an inorganic body, a body without a substantial form, and so this sort of phenomenalism in no way prevents organic bodies or corporeal substances from being thoroughly real. Finally, primary-quality phenomenalism is the view that extension and its modes (i.e., size, shape, and motion) are only phenomena (297). According to Garber, Leibniz’s acceptance of this sort of phenomenalism coheres perfectly with his interpretation because corporeal substances themselves can still exist independently of perception even if their extension is added by the perceiving mind (cf. 298-99).

Leibniz’s acceptance of primary quality phenomenalism does nevertheless raise some pointed questions about Garber’s position. In the first place, if corporeal substances are extended only in appearance and not in reality, then in what sense are they really corporeal? In what sense are their bodies really bodies? Further, earlier in the book Garber reads Leibniz as holding that though bodies do not have the finitely complex, “geometrical” shapes we ordinarily assign to them, they do in reality have infinitely complex boundaries (158-59). But how are we to reconcile this with the claim that on Leibniz’s view, shape is only an appearance and not something bodies have in reality? Garber gives us a clue as to how he might answer these questions in Chapter 4. There he likens Leibniz’s position with respect to extension and its modes to that of the orthodox mechanist with respect to color. Although on the mechanist’s view bodies are strictly speaking colorless, there is a sense in which they can be said to have a color (speaking with the vulgar) because they really do have the mechanical qualities that give rise to the appearance of color. In the same way, Garber suggests, Leibniz believes that bodies can be said to be extended, and to have shape, even though this is not strictly speaking the case, because they do contain that which gives rise to the appearance of extension and its modes, namely, passive force (160-63).

In Chapter 8, Garber turns to the thought of Leibniz’s later years. He admits that during this period Leibniz continues to accept the picture of corporeal substances nested within one another to infinity. But this picture, he argues, is transformed by the addition of something new: namely, simple, mind-like substances. In contrast to the metaphysics of the middle years, in which corporeal (or composite) substances are the basic building blocks of the created world, in the later years Leibniz assigns this role to simple substances. For much of the middle period, Garber claims, Leibniz emphasizes that real bodies must ultimately be composed of indivisible beings, specifically corporeal substances. But in the latter half of the 1690s he begins to think more in terms of simplicity or the lack of parts than indivisibility: he emphasizes that real bodies must ultimately be composed of simple beings. And corporeal substances are not simple; they are composite. So Leibniz finds it necessary to admit a new kind of entity into his ontology, the simple substance or monad. These new entities are in many ways like the substantial forms of corporeal substances, yet Garber resists identifying the two with one another, in part because monads are said to be simple and foundational, whereas Leibniz never says this about the substantial forms of the middle years.

Garber’s goal in the ninth and final chapter is to argue that Leibniz never arrives at a settled view of the relationship of bodies to monads. In support of this conclusion he offers three lines of evidence. First, during the later years Leibniz tends to vacillate between the ostensibly realist view that bodies are aggregates of monads, and the ostensibly idealist view that they are something like contents of the coherent perceptions of monads (356-67). Second, Leibniz is unsure whether monads are the only substances or whether he should also admit corporeal substances (367-72). Finally, even in those passages in which Leibniz admits corporeal substances, he is unsure how to conceive of them, whether they are soul-body unions, like the corporeal substances of the middle years, or whether they are aggregates of monads, and if the latter, whether they are united by a dominant monad or by what he calls a substantial bond (369-82). In view of all these points, Garber concludes that the monadological metaphysics of the later years is to some extent a moving target and that consequently it is difficult to determine whether Leibniz was ever really an idealist (385-87). What we are left with, in the end, is a picture of Leibniz not as a dogmatic monadologist who has the nature of things all figured out by the 1680s, some thirty years before his death, but as a “deep, subtle, and wide-ranging intellect, constantly thinking and rethinking his position, constantly engaged, who develops and grows, even if, in the end, he never arrives at a position with which he is fully satisfied” (xvi).


So what should we make of this work? On the positive side, Garber has delivered an unusually rich and subtle reading of Leibniz. Though his interpretations aren’t always convincing, he exhibits both an unsurpassed mastery of the texts and a keen sensitivity to the subtlety and complexity of Leibniz’s thought. Most notably, his meticulous story of the development of Leibniz’s thought about substance and body from his early years up through the middle years, and in particular his insightful description of the ways in which considerations of unity, persistence, and activity led Leibniz to realize that substantial forms have something to contribute to physics, is by far the best account we have of this subject. Garber also makes a cogent case for the thesis that Leibniz’s thought changes over the last three decades of his life as he continues to think and re-think his views on substance and body. He rightly observes, for example, that during the latter half of the 1690s Leibniz begins to think more in terms of simplicity than indivisibility, and for the first time explicitly identifies simple substances as the fundamental constituents of the created world. One of the lessons we can learn from Garber’s work is therefore that we must be careful not to distort Leibniz’s thought by reading his later views back into the writings of the middle years.

On the negative side, it seems to me that Garber tends to exaggerate both the extent and the significance of the changes, hesitations, and vacillations he sees in Leibniz’s thought. Perhaps the best example of this tendency occurs in connection with the supposed shift in Leibniz’s thinking about fundamental ontology toward the end of the middle period. On Garber’s view this shift is a rather dramatic one, from a conception of the physical world as grounded in real material bodies to a conception of it as grounded in immaterial substances akin to Cartesian souls. But from another point of view, one that I consider more plausible, the changes in Leibniz’s thought at this time are actually relatively minor and the basic metaphysical picture remains the same.

Consider first the claim that during the middle period Leibniz takes corporeal substances to be the basic building blocks of the physical world. As Garber explains in the following passage, he considers his best argument for this claim to be the developmental story he tells through the first six chapters of the book:

For me the best argument for this position is the developmental story I have been telling in earlier chapters. The world of corporeal substances is the world that emerges from the conception of body and the physical world that Leibniz held in the 1670s, when he faced certain problems in that largely Hobbesian conception of the world. These problems of unity and activity are largely resolved to his satisfaction by giving substantial forms, which earlier had a mainly theological role to play in his thought, work to do in the physical world. These substantial forms, understood on analogy with souls, transform organic bodies into genuine unities, and give them a source of activity. If this is the right story, there would seem to be no toehold for a monadological metaphysics in this period of Leibniz’s thought: a world grounded in corporeal substance is an elegant solution to the knotty problems that he faced with his earlier view of the world. (267)

As I noted above, this developmental story strikes me as a rather plausible one. What seems doubtful is the suggestion that this story implies that corporeal substances are fundamental to Leibniz’s ontology. It is quite true that during the middle years Leibniz thinks he can account for unity and activity in the world by introducing substantial forms, which join with bodies to make corporeal substances. But there is nothing in this story which implies that Leibniz considers these corporeal substances to be ontologically fundamental. Indeed the story is entirely consistent with the thought that it is substantial forms rather than corporeal substances that are the basic building blocks of corporeal things.

Perhaps a better justification of Garber’s claim can be found in his interpretation of Leibniz’s “aggregate argument” (74-79). According to Garber, the proper conclusion of this argument, as Leibniz presents it in the middle years, is that extended things can be real only if they are ultimately composed of corporeal substances (79); and thus since Leibniz does consider extended things real, he must believe that corporeal substances are the ultimate building blocks of the material world. To my mind, however, the texts provide very little support for this understanding of the aggregate argument. Although Leibniz does say that real bodies must be composed of corporeal substances, he never clearly or explicitly indicates that they must ultimately be composed of such substances. To take a typical example, one that Garber himself quotes in support of his position, Leibniz says that if we were to divide a body into smaller and smaller parts, we would never arrive at a real entity “unless we found animate machines whose soul or substantial form produced a substantial unity independent of the external union arising from contact.”1 As far as I can tell nothing in this statement, or any other such statement, implies that the ultimate constituents of extended beings must be animate machines or corporeal substances, as opposed to, say, the souls or substantial forms that give them their unity. Of course, nowhere in the writings of the middle years does Leibniz actually say that forms are the ultimate constituents or the basic building blocks of the material world. But then again he never says this about corporeal substances either.

Judging by what Leibniz does say during the middle years, it would appear that the substantial form is a much better candidate than the corporeal substance for the role of fundamental entity. For one thing, Leibniz maintains that every corporeal substance is composed of a substantial form and body. This fact alone would seem to suggest that forms, which he sometimes recognizes as a kind of substance, are more basic or fundamental than corporeal substances. For how can something be ultimate if it is in turn composed of more basic entities?2 In addition, Leibniz holds that corporeal substances derive their unity from their substantial forms. And since he also believes that being and unity are correlative notions,3 this would seem to imply that on his view the substantial form is also the source of a corporeal substance’s being. But if the substantial form is not only a constituent of the corporeal substance but also the source of its being and unity, then this makes the case for taking the substantial form to be the more fundamental of the two entities even stronger.

It would even appear that on the view Leibniz favors in the middle years, every material thing ultimately resolves into forms. Recall that on his view the body of a corporeal substance is an aggregate of still smaller, more fundamental corporeal substances, unities of form and body. Body is therefore always further reducible into forms and still smaller bodies. The only entities that are not further reducible are the forms. So even though corporeal substances are nested within one another to infinity, it would seem that extended things must ultimately be grounded in forms. Though the analysis of bodies into their basic building blocks is not something that could be completed in step-wise fashion, it seems hard to escape the conclusion that if anything is fundamental on this view, it is not corporeal substance, which is always further reducible, but substantial form, which is not further reducible. Even though Leibniz would not explicitly articulate such a conception of things until around 1695, it can plausibly be supposed this conception is there even in the middle years, lurking just below the surface.

Even if I am right that during the middle years the substantial form is a better candidate for fundamental entity than the corporeal substance, Garber might still maintain that this picture differs markedly from the monadological picture of the later years. For he appears to regard the monad of the later years as a new kind of entity, something not found in the earlier metaphysics (335f.). And so even if Leibniz does consider the substantial form to be fundamental during the middle years, Garber might say, the shift to thinking of monads as the fundamental entities is still a major one. The problem with this position is that it seems rather odd to construe the monad as a discovery of the late 1690s. If we compare what Leibniz says about the monad or simple substance with what he says about substantial forms in the middle period, the striking thing is just how similar they are to one another. To give just a few examples, both are said to be unextended and incorporeal substances that are always found joined with a body. Souls and minds are special cases of both, and both are to be understood on analogy with souls and minds. Both are the ultimate sources of unity and activity, indivisible, naturally indestructible, incapable of physical interaction, and representative of the entire universe. These similarities, striking as they are, suggest that the technical terms “monad” and “simple substance” may be nothing more than new names for something Leibniz had believed in for years.

In view of all this, it seems to me that the metaphysical picture Leibniz paints in the writings of the middle years is not so different from the monadology of the later years. The most substantive difference is that in the later years Leibniz explicitly affirms that simple substances are the fundamental constituents of reality, whereas in the middle years he says no such thing. But as I have argued, a good case can be made that even in the 1680s Leibniz implicitly takes substantial forms to be the most fundamental created beings. And though prior to 1695 he rarely characterizes these forms as simple or partless, it would appear that they do indeed lack parts, since they are both indivisible and incorporeal.4 We could therefore say that this change is nothing more than an instance of Leibniz making explicit aspects of his view which had been there implicitly for years.

A number of objections could also be raised against Garber’s account of Leibniz’s later thought. But since I lack the space to do that here, I will settle for the following point. In arguing for the thesis that Leibniz never arrives at what he considers a satisfactory understanding of the relationship of bodies to monads, Garber represents the idea that bodies are aggregates of monads and the idea that they are the phenomena of perceivers as incompatible strands in Leibniz’s thought. However, this is a rather controversial point that has been discussed at length over the years. Some prominent scholars have argued, with good reason, that the two accounts are compatible on the ground that Leibniz views aggregates, even aggregates of monads, as inherently phenomenal.5 Yet Garber relegates his discussion of this sort of approach to a long footnote (296n77), where he dismisses it rather quickly and, in my opinion, on inadequate grounds. At another point in the text, he suggests that if bodies are phenomena then they cannot have monads as their constituents in any real sense (364). Perhaps this is also part of the reason Garber considers these two accounts of body incompatible. The thought would be that monads must be genuine constituents of any aggregate of monads, whereas they cannot be genuine constituents of anything that, like a phenomenon, exists only in the monad itself. But Garber does not develop or defend this thought in any detail. Given the significance of the incompatibility of these strands for his claim that during the later years Leibniz never settles on what he regards as an acceptable account of body, I would have liked to see him engage more with the arguments for this approach and with the texts that seem to support it.6

Despite these problems, Garber’s book remains an immensely valuable contribution to the literature. Its combination of first-rate scholarship and provocative interpretive theses will make it essential reading for specialists working on Leibniz’s metaphysics. It would be a shame, however, if it were read only by specialists. For the story it tells is an engaging one, and even though it may ultimately fail to convince, it should appeal nonetheless to anyone interested in the vexing question of just how Leibniz came to enter the world of the monads.

1 G. W. Leibniz, Philosophical Essays, ed. R. Ariew and D. Garber (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1989), 80.

2 Cf. Garber’s suggestion that the aggregate argument, properly understood, purports to show that “for the extended things in the material world to be real, they must, ultimately, be made up of corporeal substances, unities composed of soul and body” (79). Garber does not address the tension implicit in this conclusion.

3 See, e.g., Philosophical Essays, 86.

4 Cf. Philosophical Essays, 104.

5 See, e.g., Robert M. Adams, Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist (New York: Oxford University Press, 1994), ch. 9. Cf. Paul Lodge, “Leibniz’s Notion of an Aggregate,” British Journal for the History of Philosophy 9 (2001), 467-86.

6 See, e.g., Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe (Berlin: Akademie-Verlag, 1923), 6.6:146; Philosophical Essays, 263.