Leibniz: Nature and Freedom

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Donald Rutherford and J. A. Cover (eds.), Leibniz: Nature and Freedom, Oxford University Press, 2005, 288pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0195143752.

Reviewed by John Whipple, University of California, Irvine and Alan Nelson, University of California, Irvine


Leibniz: Nature and Freedom is an excellent volume of original essays on the philosophy of Leibniz. Donald Rutherford and J. A. Cover have succeeded in bringing together a strong collection of essays from leading Leibniz scholars. The essays are unified by their addressing the work of Robert Sleigh, to whom the volume is dedicated. Sleigh's work on Leibniz's fundamental metaphysics, especially as it appears in Leibniz's middle period, and on theodician issues, are explicitly discussed in nearly all the contributions. The essays provide an overview of the current state of Leibniz research, and advance our understanding of his philosophical system on a number of fronts.

Rutherford and Cover have written a useful introduction to the volume. The initial sections, which describe the development of Leibniz studies in the twentieth century, and provide a lucid and concise overview of Leibniz's philosophical system, will prove invaluable to any non-specialists who happen to pick up the book. Using the Monadology as a point of reference, they introduce the central features of the Leibnizian system, and isolate some of the major interpretive controversies concerning it. They also place Leibniz's views in their proper seventeenth-century context, particularly in relation to the views of Descartes, Spinoza, and Malebranche. The introduction also includes a helpful summary of each of the articles included in the volume.

Mark Kulstad begins "The One and the Many and Kinds of Distinctness" by noting several forms of the problem of the one and the many that Leibniz engages throughout his philosophical career. The main issue that Kulstad discusses in the paper is whether Leibniz ever embraced monism as a solution to this problem. It is well known that Leibniz vehemently rejects monism in his mature metaphysics, but a few early texts are, in fact, suggestive of such a view. Kulstad provides a helpful framework for the discussion by distinguishing monism (roughly the view that there is only one substance) from pantheism (roughly the view that God is all and all is God), and then articulating four versions of monism and four versions of pantheism. He utilizes four kinds of distinctness -- numerical, mereological, "constituential," and real (in something like Descartes's technical sense) to achieve this eight-fold classification. Kulstad's main thesis is that Leibniz endorses real distinction pantheism (the doctrine that God exists and nothing is really distinct from God) and real distinction monism (the doctrine that substance exists and there exist no x and y such that x and y are substances and x is really distinct from y) in a 1676 text. In his careful reconstruction of the 1676 argument, Kulstad appeals to Descartes's account of real distinction. This is a plausible move, for the text bears striking similarities to the famous real distinction passage of the Meditations. However, it is crucial to note a fundamental difference between the Cartesian account and that found in the 1676 text. Kulstad reads the latter text as affirming that things are really distinct only if one can be perfectly (Descartes would say "clearly and distinctly") understood without another. And to understand one thing apart from another is to understand the requisites of one thing without understanding the requisites of the other. It is at precisely this point that Leibniz diverges from Descartes, for Leibniz's conception of a "requisite" is "that without which a thing cannot exist." According to Descartes, one need not conceive all the requisites of a thing in order to perceive it clearly and distinctly. This means that two things (e.g., mind and body) can be really distinct even if they share a requisite. As a matter of fact, all finite Cartesian substances, and even the monads of Leibniz's mature metaphysics, do have a common requisite, namely God. We are thus led to a surprising conclusion: according to the 1676 account of real distinction, both Descartes and the mature Leibniz are real distinction monists and pantheists! The moral of the story is that the conditions on real distinction in the 1676 text are so hard to satisfy that it is difficult to see how any theistic philosopher could escape real distinction monism or pantheism.

Christia Mercer's, "Leibniz and Sleigh on Substantial Unity," sets out to tackle a problem set by Sleigh's treatment of the middle Leibniz. The question comes about in this way. Suppose (contrary to fact as Sleigh would have it) that in his middle period Leibniz thought that corporeal substance, realistically construed, could derive its substantiality from the soul. This means that the soul must confer completeness, causal autonomy, unity, and contain a developmental law. How can the soul meet all these requirements? Mercer convincingly shows that the thinking of the young Leibniz carefully tracked an amalgamated Neoplatonism. This philosophy has the soul, an active principle, emanate its influence through the body, a passive principle, resulting in humans (for example). Although they did not do much to articulate the details of this theory, Mercer shows that the Neoplatonists verbally (at least) made all the theoretical connections that the middle Leibniz (at least) took to be important. One feels that Mercer must be right that an examination of these texts and issues sheds much light on the structure of Leibniz's metaphysics, even his most mature metaphysics, but her work also intensifies the problem of dating Leibniz's final idealistic rejection of realistically construed bodies. This problem is addressed in the next two articles -- a neat example of the organic unity of the whole volume.

Samuel Levey's "Leibniz on Precise Shapes and the Corporeal World" extends his recent work to a defense of an interpretation of the middle Leibniz that makes him a realist about the corporeality of corporeal substances. Leibniz argued that shape is unreal and this has, naturally, been taken as part of an argument that extension is ideal and that bodies must be understood idealistically. Levey means to block this particular anti-realist argument. His main device is to take Leibniz to be concluding that shapes are infinitely complex, instead of unreal. So a corporeal substance is a composite of a substantial form and prime matter resulting in bodies that are real and have fractal structure. This would commit Leibniz to real motion as well; Levey is aware of the implication and proposes to handle it by taking absolute, non-relative motions to be fully real. This leaves us with the question, first forcefully posed by Daniel Garber, of whether Leibniz blundered into this Aristotelianism about corporeal substance only to realize his mistake in the 1700's when he completely overhauled his philosophical system. An alternative view is that the texts of the middle years express the later, explicit idealism in a more cautious, conservative-sounding manner.

Garber's contribution, "Leibniz and Idealism," returns to this question. In this paper he softens his controversial and highly influential claim that Leibniz was a realist about corporeal substance in the middle years. But he does not soften it to the point of embracing the alternative proto-idealistic view. After providing meticulous analyses of a number of key middle-years texts, he concludes that Leibniz simply does not have a firm opinion on whether idealism or one of its contraries is true. Garber suggests that the issue of idealism is not at the forefront of his mind during this period. Leibniz is primarily concerned with refuting the Cartesian account of body, and replacing it with his own account, according to which body is composed of corporeal substances. The notion of corporeal substance, in turn, is not subjected to a deep enough level of analysis for Leibniz to fully address the question of idealism.

Catherine Wilson's, "Compossibility, Expression, Accommodation," addresses the relationship among these Leibnizian notions. Leibniz understood them as very tightly connected, but how tightly? Sleigh, in his work on the middle Leibniz, argued that Leibniz was not entitled to claim that they mutually entail one another. One response to Sleigh would be to display the equivalence Leibniz saw at the foundational level of simple substances. For a set of simple substances to be understood by God as eligible for creation, it is trivially true that they be compossible. But what it is to be a monad is to express its worldmates and, to some degree, God. This in turn is naturally described by saying that each monad's perception is constrained by the perceptions of its worldmates. And that is enough for a metaphysical accommodation.

Wilson, however, provides a richer account in which we understand Leibniz as getting expression and especially accommodation at the phenomenal level and not the most basic metaphysical level. Her idea is that the "value added" concepts of expression and accommodation are projections of the basic level to our spatiotemporal world of bodies in motion. Brute mathematical expression is not to be divorced from the harmonization of bodies (one of Sleigh's worries) because such "curve fitting" abstracts from all the connections to be discovered among bodies. Wilson elegantly uses examples to drive home the point that our aesthetic or unscientific appreciation of apparent disharmony in our own best of all possible worlds is fully compatible with underlying order. The Three Stooges on a camping trip are unable to accommodate their actions to each other and their surroundings in a thick, value-laden sense of 'accommodate.' But all their actions are fully consistent with laws of physics so the Stooges "accommodate" each other in a more basic sense. The thick sense of 'accommodate' is perceptually relative; in other possible worlds thick accommodation would be harder for its inhabitants to find. This would seem to solve Sleigh's problem.

In "Leibniz on Spontaneity" Donald Rutherford provides an illuminating treatment of Leibniz's views on that subject. The general aim of the paper is to explain how Leibniz's views on spontaneity relate to his account of freedom. Rutherford argues that Leibniz is committed to two accounts of spontaneity, monadic and agent, which he explains in considerable detail. All of the states of a substance are spontaneous in the former sense (roughly put, they "arise from a substance's own depths"), but only some of them are spontaneous in the latter, namely, those that are brought about by a substance's desire for some future good. The account of agent spontaneity thus allows Leibniz to distinguish between cases in which a substance acts freely and cases in which a substance is constrained by external causes. This does not mean, however, that monadic spontaneity is unrelated to Leibniz's account of freedom (as many commentators have supposed), for Leibniz's account of agent spontaneity presupposes the truth of monadic spontaneity. Rutherford is thereby able to explain Leibniz's well-known assertion in the Theodicy that spontaneity constitutes the "body and basis" of freedom.

Leibniz has traditionally been interpreted as being a compatibilist with respect to the relation between freedom and determinism. Michael Murray challenges this standard view in "Spontaneity and Freedom in Leibniz." He argues that Leibniz appropriates an account of moral necessity found in the writings of Spanish Jesuits according to which the spontaneous actions of a substance are morally necessary, but not metaphysically or physically necessary. On this account, the choice of the will follows infallibly from, but is not physically determined by, a substance's desires for things apprehended as good. This version of moral necessitarianism is taken to occupy a conceptual space between full-blown libertarianism, which Leibniz repeatedly denounces, and strict compatibilism. Murray concedes that some of Leibniz's metaphysical principles and doctrines (e.g., the principle of sufficient reason and his account of intra-substantial causation) seem to push him in the direction of compatibilism, but he thinks that theological considerations ultimately lead Leibniz to embrace an anti-compatibilist view. He reads Leibniz as holding that the causal determination of a substance's actions would be sufficient to deflect moral responsibility from the creature to the creator, thereby making God the author of sin. Murray thinks that nothing less than Jesuit moral necessity will allow Leibniz to block these unacceptable conclusions.

In "Moral Necessity" Robert M. Adams employs a methodology different from Murray's, and he achieves very different results. He thinks that we should not rely on the Jesuit tradition to provide the content for an interpretation of Leibnizian moral necessity, suggesting instead that an accurate interpretation can be achieved through a careful and systematic analysis of Leibniz's own writings. Adams argues that these texts -- including several that have been taken to intimate anti-compatibilist sympathies in Leibniz -- present a straightforwardly compatibilist account of moral necessity. In the Theodicy, for example, Leibniz opposes moral necessity to physical and absolute necessity. This opposition does not constitute a rejection of the determination of choice tout court (as Murray supposes), but only the rejection of a value free mechanism for determining choice. Morally necessary choices are just as determined as the motions of bodies; the difference between these two cases is that only the former are determined by the value or apparent value of an end. On Adams' interpretation, this value/apparent value is strictly sufficient to determine a substance's action -- a conclusion that draws support from the requirements of preestablished harmony, and Leibniz's use of mechanical analogies to explain the choice of the will. Adams concludes his paper with an insightful discussion of the relation between moral and metaphysical necessity. This discussion, which focuses on the principle of sufficient reason, underscores his conviction that Leibniz's remarks on moral necessity do not allow for a softer reading of his determinism.

Sean Greenberg assesses Leibniz's critique of the Molinist account of freedom in "Leibniz Against Molinism." The Molinist account can be glossed as follows: if all of the requisites for action have been posited, and a person is still able to act or to not act, then a person is free. This conception of freedom, which emphasizes the indifference of the will, was criticized by Leibniz throughout his philosophical career. Many of Leibniz's criticisms focus on the claim that Molinist freedom is incompatible with the principle of sufficient reason. Greenberg challenges the verdict of several recent commentators who have taken this sort of criticism to be quite powerful, arguing instead that Molinists, such as Suarez, have the resources to rebut this charge. But he thinks that Leibniz has a deeper and more powerful objection that stems from his theory of the mind. Molinist freedom presupposes an account of the will in which it is functionally distinct from perceptions. The Leibnizian will, however, is not functionally distinct from perceptions; it consists in the consciousness of appetitions (which are only conceptually distinct from perceptions). There is thus no room in the Leibnizian mind, as it were, for the Molinist will. Leibnizian freedom, according to Greenberg, is essentially freedom of the understanding.

In the final essay of the volume, "Video Meliora Probque, Deteriora Sequor," Jack Davidson explores Leibniz's view on the source of sin. It is uncontroversial that Leibniz should be broadly construed as an intellectualist (one who holds that a person never willingly does wrong), but there are different versions of intellectualism. Davidson distinguishes strong intellectualism (the view that sin only involves cognitive error) from weak intellectualism (the view that sin always involves cognitive error, but not necessarily only cognitive error), arguing that Leibniz affirmed the former in some of his earliest works (e.g., the Confessio), and the latter in his philosophical maturity. Davidson's reconstruction of Leibniz's weak intellectualist account emphasizes the essential embodiment of Leibnizian minds. Embodied creatures have passions, and passions can occlude the intellect's perception of the good. This allows Leibniz to explain how an agent at t2 can act contrary to what she judged to be right at t1 (a phenomenon that Davidson calls "synchronic akrasia"). The final sections of Davidson's paper relate Leibniz's weak intellectualism to his views on moral therapy, spiritual enlightenment, and culpability.