Leibniz on Causation and Agency

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Julia Jorati, Leibniz on Causation and Agency, Cambridge University Press, 2017, 224pp., $99.99, ISBN 9781107192676.

Reviewed by Marc Bobro, Santa Barbara City College


Works in the history of philosophy, including book-length interpretations of Leibniz's thought, typically adopt one of two approaches. At one extreme is the "fossil bed" approach whose sole aim is to determine what a dead philosopher thought. There is no real attempt to judge its philosophical merits nor, especially, to relate its ideas to current developments. This is historical history of philosophy. Daniel Garber's books come to mind. At the other extreme, there is philosophical history of philosophy. Such works are not especially concerned with getting a philosopher right, but to determine whether that philosopher was right. Jonathan Bennett's books represent this tendency. Julia Jorati's book seems a perfect blend of these two approaches: history with philosophy. To my mind, its most compelling feature is her case that Leibniz not only has a complex and persuasive philosophy of action, but also offers an account that is actually relevant for the current debate on human agency. Yet she does not mortise Leibniz's view into some preferred theory of action. The book combines a very careful attempt to get Leibniz right with a recognition that the historical Leibniz gets the philosophy right as well. However, this third approach carries with it its own obstacles and, if I have any reservations about Jorati's otherwise excellent book, they are along these lines.

Chapter 1 covers the fundamentals of Leibniz's monadic metaphysics and ontology, from which the issues of the subsequent chapters will be drawn. This chapter also serves to indicate what issues will not be discussed. It contains an excellent and detailed discussion of monadic perception and appetite. Are perceptions and appetites distinct, and, if so, in what way? How do these relate to the question of what monadic activity consists in? The chapter culminates in a discussion of the differences between efficient, formal, and final causes in the actions of monads. Jorati argues, I think correctly, that "monads themselves -- rather than their modifications -- are the efficient and formal causes of their actions" (27). She argues also that the objects of perceptions, the ends themselves, are the final causes.

Chapter 2 covers the vexed issue of spontaneity in Leibniz: how "to distinguish between actions and passions, or between things that we do and things that happen to us" (37). This is a central question in the philosophy of action. Leibniz defines a spontaneous action as one that originates within the agent instead of being foisted on the agent from without. Jorati distinguishes between three progressively narrower, or as she nicely puts it, "more demanding," types of spontaneity -- metaphysical, agent, and rational -- and indicates the importance of each category. Rational spontaneity is defined as "the agent's self-determination by her will and intellect" (54) and is crucial for understanding Leibniz's theory of freedom. Freedom, Jorati argues, is "determination by the agent's rational faculties, independently of nonrational influences" (54). Perhaps the most interesting element here is Jorati's discussion of the fact that her view of Leibniz closely resembles the "endorsement theory of autonomy," as described by contemporary philosophers of action, or the "Platonic Model." One's autonomy, on such a model, "can be undermined not only by other agents and external factors but also by appetites or impulses that are internal to the agent's mind" (56). In this chapter, we also start to get what I consider to be a hallmark of Jorati's writing: good, down-to-earth examples, often missing from other Leibniz commentaries.

Chapter 3 demonstrates clearly how important teleology is to Leibniz's philosophy of action. All genuine activity is telic on Jorati's interpretation of Leibniz -- there is final causation in all monadic actions, not just in minds and souls, but also in bare monads. On her interpretation, these three types of teleology correspond to three types of spontaneity. Her tables summarizing these correspondences are fantastic (77). Jorati wields the texts in very careful and nuanced manner and rarely speculates or attempts to speak for Leibniz. She lets him speak; it's not as if he has little to say. The chief conclusion of this chapter is that while all activity is telic, not all teleology is goodness-directed. A monad's goal-directedness does not have to consist in its striving for the good. I see an obstacle for contemporary theory of action here. Jorati thinks that Leibniz offers a theory of action that stands some chance of being true. But is his view that all genuine activity is telic, whether or not it is goodness-directed, accepted by any contemporary philosopher of action?

Chapter 4 addresses a significant interpretive problem: how to reconcile individual, substantial action with divine concurrence. According to Leibniz, God concurs with the activity of monads. But how can Leibniz reconcile this doctrine with the spontaneity that is necessary for being a genuinely free substance? Jorati includes a nice discussion of a boat analogy often employed by Leibniz as a way of illustrating his own view. Many a commentator has addressed this analogy and it is interesting to see this dispute clearly brought to light. Jorati works through several competing interpretations, and defends her own solution, which invokes both formal and final causation. Surprisingly enough, she argues that Leibniz's view (at least if we follow her interpretation) works: "There is ultimately no tension between Leibniz's concurrentism on the one hand and creaturely spontaneity, freedom, and authorship on the other" (113).

Chapter 5 addresses the topic of freedom, which surely has vexed every student of Leibniz at some point. Leibniz is well-known as an agent-causal compatibilist, but is often argued to have failed in providing a philosophically defensible view, typically for the reason that his determinism does not allow for contingency. Jorati argues that Leibniz's attempt to reconcile freedom and contingency with determinism is actually successful -- that he can consistently hold both that all of the natural changes of created substances are deterministic and that "free actions are caused by agents rather than by events internal or external to the agent" (115). Leibniz is able to achieve this, Jorati argues, by endorsing a very stringent form of self-determinism, without lapsing into Spinozistic necessitarianism. Again, Jorati defends the philosophy of Leibniz. One problem I see is that Jorati's defense appears to commit Leibniz to the view that violations of the Principle of Sufficient Reason must be possible. This principle is typically read as the claim that there are no cases where it makes sense to say, "This is the way it is -- this is the current state of affairs -- but there is no explanation why it is the way it is and not some other way." In other words, there are no brute facts. Attributing to Leibniz the denial of the metaphysical or logical necessity of the Principle of Sufficient Reason is a very controversial claim that needs explication and defense. It cuts against the view of a vast majority of Leibniz commentators.

Chapter 6 explicitly addresses Leibniz's moral psychology, specifically covering the concepts of control, weakness of will, and compulsion. There is an extended discussion of mastery, of two types -- direct and indirect. Nowhere else in Leibniz scholarship is this topic discussed in detail, and Jorati should be commended for her discussion. She compares Leibniz's account of indirect mastery to that of Susan Wolf, while referring to recent work by John Martin Fischer and Mark Ravizza. Also, this chapter contains an extended and fascinating account of akrasia in Leibniz. The main question is whether akrasia is even possible on Leibniz's view. Jorati argues in the affirmative; we can knowingly and culpably act against our better judgment. This leads into an interesting discussion of motivation -- for instance, how the motivational force of a desire is not the same as the degree to which the desire's object seems good to the agent. Leibniz's account of "weakness of will" is, Jorati argues, structurally similar to Alfred Mele's. This chapter most transparently exemplifies Jorati's effort to reveal a Leibniz that is amenable to current philosophers.

Chapter 7 covers moral agency. This of course relates closely to the issues of spontaneity, rationality, and freedom; however, there is little discussion of embodiment. Why even have bodies, given the nature of monads as spontaneous beings, especially since the mature Leibniz -- Jorati's avowed focus, as she states in the Introduction -- is known for a kind of ontological idealism? Only a few sentences address this question (184). Jorati tells us that the book won't venture into such territory; however, I'm not convinced that there's good reason to avoid the topic, especially in relation to moral agency. For this is where the issue of the agency of rational substances runs up against the agency of others. Moral agency presupposes moral community. There is not enough discussion of community, and in general, the book avoids the issues of bodies and organisms. So much of the book is about spontaneous individual, monadic action. There are intriguing hints as to what Jorati thinks of the matter: "the capacity for loving . . . one's neighbors" is "crucial for moral agency" (193). But I'm left asking for more. Is moral agency why we need bodies?

Jorati's impressive book certainly brings final causation and teleology clearly and comprehensively into the account of Leibnizian monads. But it seems that Jorati could have been more critical of Leibniz. Ultimately, is Leibniz's philosophy of action too telic, too end-directed? Not all of our actions are goal-directed. Is Leibniz's philosophy of action as good as Jorati argues? There is no real recognition of the possibility of atelic action. Why would teleology be required for moral responsibility, or even independence? How is it possible that Leibniz's view aligns with current ones, especially given some of his methodological constraints? His constraints included those under which today's philosophers tend not to operate, namely, the moral and the religious. But to be fair, as Jorati herself writes, the book is not intended to answer all of our questions about Leibnizian causation and agency. It is enough that it whets our appetite for more discussion. All told, Jorati's book is a much-needed addition to Leibniz scholarship. I highly recommend it to all commentators and students of Leibniz, as well as those philosophers of action whose are interested either in the historical debate or in some foundational work from Leibniz relevant to their own work.