Leibniz on Compossibility and Possible Worlds

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Gregory Brown and Yual Chiek (eds.), Leibniz on Compossibility and Possible Worlds, Springer, 2016, 256pp., $99.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783319426938.

Reviewed by Jeffrey K. McDonough, Harvard University


The old chestnut asks: why something rather than nothing? Why birds and bees and sunshine in the meadows? Leibniz's reply is swift and easy: because existence is good. God creates because it is good that there are birds and bees and sunshine in the meadows. The old query is answered but a new one emerges. If existence is good, why doesn't God create more? Why not mountains of gold and rivers of chocolate? Why not a Caesar who stops, a Judas who doesn't sin?

Leibniz maintains that God does not actualize all possibilities because not all possible substances are compossible. That is to say, he insists that God cannot create all possible substances together. But why not? What are the foundations within Leibniz's philosophy for the incompossiblity of possible substances? Three broad interpretations have emerged in answer to this question. In what follows, I highlight those three broad interpretations and indicate how the essays in this volume develop and criticize them. I conclude with a brief assessment of the volume as a whole.

Logical interpretations suggest that incompossibility is ultimately grounded in logical inconsistency. The core idea rests on three points. First, each possible substance is defined by a complete concept in the divine intellect. There is, for example, a complete concept of Caesar in the divine intellect that is tantamount to a blueprint for creating Caesar in every detail. Second, the complete concept of each substance has logical implications concerning other possible substances. Caesar's complete concept might logically entail Pompey's complete concept and be logically inconsistent with Titus Andronicus's complete concept. Third, two possible substances are compossible if and only if their complete concepts are mutually consistent; they are incompossible if and only if they are logically inconsistent.

Opponents of logical interpretations standardly object that logical interpretations fail to do justice to the independence of Leibniz's substances. The worry here is both philosophical and textual. Philosophically, one might think, for example, that if Caesar's essence entails Pompey's essence and Pompey's essence entails Caesar's essence, then Caesar and Pompey can't be genuinely distinct substances. To many, logical interpretations thus seem to leave Leibniz dangerously close to Spinoza's substance monism, a result he adamantly seeks to avoid. Textually, there are numerous passages in which Leibniz implies that God could create any substance without any of its worldmates. In a letter of 6 April 1715, for example, Bartholomew Des Bosses objects that Leibniz's theory of pre-established harmony commits him to the view that "God could not have created any of those monads that exist in this way without producing all the others that now exist in the same way" (LDB 335). But Leibniz demurs. He insists that, absolutely speaking, God could create one actual substance without any others even if he is prevented from doing so by his decision to "act always most wisely and most harmoniously" (LDB 339).

Several essays in this volume, including those by Ohad Nachtomy, Adam Harmer, Yual Chiek and Mogens Lærke develop key ideas related to logical interpretations. Harmer, for example, develops a distinction between what he calls "basic" and "strict" ontological independence. If Caesar is ontologically independent of Pompey in Harmer's basic sense, then the existence of Caesar does not require the existence of Pompey but may exclude the existence of Titus. If Caesar is ontologically independent of Pompey in Harmer's strict sense, then Caesar does not require the existence of Pompey nor exclude the existence of Titus. Harmer's distinction is coherent and might be tantalizing to those wishing to square the circle of logical incompossibility and ontological independence. For if Leibniz were committed only to basic but not strict ontological independence, he could maintain that while Caesar can exist without any other substances, no substance that is not a Caesar-worldmate can exist with Caesar. Caesar would be ontologically independent in a strong sense and yet couldn't be created together with, say, Titus on pain of logical contradiction. A nice result, if you can get it. It is not easy to see, however, how (merely) basic but not strict independence might be defended in a manner that is not ad hoc, and, in this volume at least, Harmer does not take on the task of showing that his distinction between basic and strict independence does any work in Leibniz's own thinking about incompossiblity.

Lawful and cosmological interpretations typically assume that possible substances are logically independent of one another. Strictly speaking, at one extreme, God could create a single substance alone. At the other extreme, God could create all possible substances together. They standardly suggest that God is precluded from instantiating non-realized possible substances by some extra-logical constraint. Lawful interpretations maintain that God is precluded from creating other substances by the goal, or demand, of instantiating elegant laws (see, for example, Russell 1997, 66-7, and Cover and O'Leary-Hawthorne 1999, 131-41). Cosmological interpretations maintain that God is precluded from creating other substances by the goal, or demand, of instantiating a world as opposed to a mere collection of substances.

Opponents of lawful and cosmological interpretations raise three main worries. First, Leibniz is committed to the view that existence itself is good. In contrast to logical interpretations, lawful and cosmological interpretations grant that God could create more. But why then -- to return to our original question -- doesn't God create more? Why does God favor elegant laws, or a single world over the existence of more substances or more worlds? Second, lawful interpretations have typically suggested that God faces a trade-off. God could create more substances at the expense of less elegant laws, or more elegant laws at the expense of fewer substances. But Leibniz's texts indicate that this underestimates his optimism. Leibniz appears to hold that the actual world contains both the most being and the most elegant laws (A.6.4.1538/L 306). There is no trade-off. But if that's right, it is hard to see how instantiating elegant laws can serve as a constraint on the creation of substances. Third, cosmological interpretations rely heavily upon the notion of a world as opposed to a mere collection of substances. But what exactly is a world for Leibniz? What conditions must be satisfied in order for a collection of substances to merit the apparently vaunted status of being a world?

Several essays develop key ideas related to lawful and cosmological interpretations. Those by Sebastian Bender, Thomas Feeney, Julia Joráti, Gregory Brown and James Messina all work out core ideas related to lawful and cosmological interpretations. Joráti's "wisdom approach" is rooted in her account of God's faculties. As Joráti has it, we can distinguish at least three divine faculties: God's intellect, God's wisdom, and God's will. These three faculties are governed by three corresponding principles: the principle of contradiction, the principle of sufficient reason, and the principle of the best. Joráti's thought is that incompossibility is ultimately grounded in divine wisdom and its corresponding principle, the principle of sufficient reason. Substances that are not mutually harmonious do not satisfy the demands of divine wisdom and the principle of sufficient reason and so are not compossible. Joráti's account promises not only to shed light on incompossibilty but also the nature of divine attributes. Nonetheless, one might wonder if Joráti's proffered solution doesn't threaten to put Leibniz's God in a bind. On the one hand, Leibniz holds that existence itself is good so God has a reason for instantiating every possible substance. On the other hand, if Joráti is right, then God has a reason -- grounded directly in his faculty of wisdom -- to not instantiate every possible substance. What then should God do? Absent an independent constraint, if God does not instantiate every possible substance, he violates the principle of sufficient reason. But if Joráti is right, and he does instantiate every possible substance, he also violates the principle of sufficient reason. By grounding incompossibility directly in God's wisdom and the principle of sufficient reason -- as opposed to an independent constraint -- Joráti's reading thus might seem to leave Leibniz's God with both a reason to create and a reason not to create more substances.

A third interpretative approach is motivated by Leibniz's appeals to packing analogies in articulating his understanding of incompossibility. For example, in a famous passage from "On the Radical Origination of Things," Leibniz writes:

It is obvious that of the infinite combinations of possibilities and possible series, the one that exists is the one through which the most essence or possibility is brought into existence . . . the situation is like that in certain games, in which all places on the board are supposed to be filled in accordance with certain rules, where at the end, blocked by certain spaces, you will be forced to leave more places empty than you could have or wanted to, unless you used some trick. There is, however, a certain procedure through which one can most easily fill the board. . . . And so, assuming that at some time being is to prevail over nonbeing, or that there is a reason why something rather than nothing is to exist, or that something is to pass from possibility to actuality, although nothing beyond this is determined, it follows that there would be as much as there possibly can be, given the capacity of time and space (that is, the capacity of the order of possible existence); in a word, it is just like tiles laid down so as to contain as many as possible in a given area. (G 7:303/AG 150-151)

Leibniz's packing analogies imply that God does not instantiate more possible substances because there is literally no room for them. They suggest that in deciding which substances to instantiate, God takes into account the intrinsic perfection of each substance together with the "cost" of creating it in terms of the other substances it would preclude. In creating the best of all possible worlds, God creates the unique collection of substances that optimizes perfection.

There are at least two obvious worries that may be raised in connection with the packing interpretation. The first is to wonder how Leibniz's packing analogies might be applied to worlds of infinite expanse. Granting that it is easy to see how the instantiation of some possible substances could preclude the instantiation of other possible substances in a finite space, one might still wonder if the instantiation of possible substances could be similarly precluded in an infinite space. If it is easy to see how one might optimize the laying of tiles on a finite board, it is much harder to see how one might optimize the laying of tiles on an infinite board. The second is to wonder how Leibniz's packing analogies might be applied to worlds exhaustively constituted by unextended, ideal substances. If one can see how the creation of some corporeal substances might preclude the creation other corporeal substances, it is much more difficult to see how the creation of some unextended minds might preclude the creation of other unextended minds.

Although the packing interpretation is discussed in most of the essays in this volume, none of the authors rises to its defense. In their introduction, Brown and Chiek, however, raise what seems to me to be a puzzling objection to the packing interpretation, an objection that draws on Brown's essay. Brown argues that "any possible world, were it instantiated, would give rise to a well-founded plenum, that is, a phenomenal world, in which all spaces are filled with well-founded bodies" (201). In their introduction, Brown and Chiek suggest that the same conclusion should apply mutatis mutandis to corporeal substance worlds. Any possible corporeal substance world, by their lights, would have to be a material plenum. So far, so good. But then they suggest that their conclusion, combined with "Leibniz's assumption that matter is infinitely divided," entails that all corporeal substance worlds must be equally dense with perfection since "every possible world would have an unbounded perfection density" (14). But it is hard to see how this follows from their premises. Take a cubic meter of some possible world. Let it be a plenum. Let it be infinitely divided. Must it have an unbounded perfection density? Not obviously. For suppose that it is infinitely divided into parts following the convergent series 1/2, 1/4, 1/8, 1/16, etc. Why couldn't the region be a plenum, be infinitely divided and yet its perfection be bounded like the convergent series itself? There may, indeed, be deep difficulties for the packing interpretation lurking in Leibniz's commitments to plenum worlds and infinite divisibility. If there are, however, uncovering them will, it seems, require more steps than Brown and Chiek's quick argument suggests.

The articles in this volume are uniformly of high quality with a welcome mixture of well-established scholars and new lights to the field. The introduction by Brown and Chiek provides a clear overview of the issues as well as the contents of the articles. This volume will be essential reading for those interested in the topic of compossibility and will be a welcome supplement to anyone interested in Leibniz's metaphysics. It is an excellent collection and a worthy testament to the subtlety of Leibniz's views on compossibility.

References to Leibniz's Works

A = Sämtliche Schriften und Briefe. Deutsche Akademie der Wissenschaften zu Berlin, eds. (Akademie-Verlag, 1923-). Reference is to series, volume, and page.

AG = Philosophical Essays, R. Ariew and D. Garber, eds. and trans. (Hackett, 1989).

L = L. E. Loemker, ed. and trans., Philosophical Papers and Letters 2nd edition (Reidel, 1969)

LDB = The Leibniz-Des Bosses Correspondence, Brandon C. Look and Donald Rutherford, ed. and trans. (Yale University Press, 2007). Reference is to original language page.

G = Die Philosophische Schriften von Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, G C. I. Gerhardt, ed., (Weidmann, 1875-90; repr. Hildesheim: Olms, 1960). Reference is to volume and page.