Leibniz: Protestant Theologian

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Irena Backus, Leibniz: Protestant Theologian, Oxford University Press, 2016, 322pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199891849.

Reviewed by Mogens Lærke, CNRS/ ENS de Lyon


Irena Backus' long-awaited monograph focuses on Leibniz's outlook on protestant theology, especially Calvinist theology, from the viewpoint of his own "evangelical" position (that is to say, Lutheran -- but Leibniz disliked the denomination, which he felt was sectarian.) She organizes her study thematically into three parts. The first part, containing two chapters, is about the "Eucharist and Substance." Backus here dedicates the most discussion to demonstrate that Leibniz's philosophical attempts at explaining transubstantiation in texts dating from the De transubstantiatione (1668) to the Examen religionis christianae (1686) were mainly about overcoming challenges to revealed religion posed by Cartesianism. She also, more convincingly, resituates Leibniz's position on the Eucharist in the Unvorgreiffliches Bedencken (1698-1704) in the more straightforward theological context of irenic negotiations. The second part, including chapters 3 through 5, grapples with questions of "Predestination and Necessity." Leibniz's determinist philosophy, which Backus reads along the lines of Robert Adams while drawing also extensively on Michael Griffin (Adams 1994; Griffin 2012), is placed in the context of the philosophical positions held by Hobbes, Locke and Newton and, in a separate chapter, St. Augustine. The third part is concerned with Leibniz as a "historian of the sacred" by which we should not understand a "church historian" but someone "who thought all civil history, including sacred history, a revelation of God's will" (p. 204).

This last part represents, in my opinion, the most original part of the book and is a very welcome addition to a field of study -- Leibniz's biblical exegesis, approach to historical testimony in the theological context, and the ontological grounding of the revealed truth of Scripture -- that has, despite its richness, received very limited attention in the secondary literature. Drawing heavily on a little known but important text, the Contemplatio de historia litteraria statuque praesenti eruditionis from 1682, Backus shows, in chapter 6, how Leibniz's adoption of the classic argument according to which the Bible is authenticated by the prophetic coherence of the two Testaments, also defended by Leibniz's close ally Pierre-Daniel Huet, plays into a general conception of real history as the progressive realization of divine providence, a historia sacra (p. 162; cf. Lærke 2015, p. 107-283). The ensuing analysis, in chapter 7, of Leibniz's reading of the Apocalypse, studied in the context of Grotius' and Newton's writings on the same topic and a discussion of their respective positions on early heresy, is an impressive exercise in comparative theology and historical biblical exegesis that only a professional historian of religion could perform.

Over the last two decades, Backus, a highly regarded historian of Calvinism, has contributed numerous foundational articles on Leibniz's theological preoccupations. I would, therefore, have preferred to confirm that the present book represents the pinnacle of those efforts, providing the kind of new standard work on Leibniz's protestant theology from her hand that those in the Leibniz community interested in theological matters have waited for with impatience for years. But there are reasons that I cannot do that. Backus' work contains an incredible amount of information and detailed analysis of Leibniz's theological texts. It is, in many ways, an impeccable work of scholarship. Containing enormously well-documented references to the available texts and exceedingly careful in handling them, it affords us a wealth of knowledge in an area of Leibniz studies where there remains much to be done and from which essential lessons can be drawn that are likely to produce ripple effects throughout our understanding of his entire intellectual enterprise. Backus deals authoritatively with topics -- such as Leibniz's take on history and the Bible -- which only few philosophically trained Leibniz scholars are capable of discussing in a qualified way. In that respect her book keeps its promise by marking out entirely new territory for interrogation, especially in the third part. It does, however, also suffer from deep-seated problems in its general approach that cast a shadow over a study presented as a future work of reference.

A first concern is the framework of commentary literature in which it is set, which comes through as oddly outdated. While Backus does acknowledge the existence of most recent work on Leibniz's theology and draws on it in her particular analyses, she principally situates herself in relation to two more than a century old commentaries by Alois Pichler (Die Theologie des Leibniz, 2 vols., 1869-1870) and Jean Baruzi (Leibniz et l'organisation religieuse de la terre, 1907), claiming that "there has not been an authoritative monograph on Leibniz as a theologian since the works of Pichler and Baruzi" (p. 3). Those are valuable studies indeed, but one would expect a new commentary to also dialogue with other contemporary studies, and I beg to differ with regard to the odd contention that there are no recent authoritative monographs on Leibniz as a theologian. In fact, historians of philosophy have in recent years written extensively on the topic, including monographs. Among these, the most striking examples are Claire Rösler's massive French dissertation on the irenic negotiations between Leibniz, Molanus and Jablonski (Rösler 2009; a substantial part is published in Rösler 2013) and Maria Rosa Antognazza's splendid Leibniz on the Trinity and the Incarnation (Antognazza 2007; the book is an English translation and extended version of Antognazza 1999). To be sure, despite the remarks quoted above, Backus is aware of these newer studies and acknowledges their existence in the Introduction (p. 2-3). But she very rarely draws on their insights or discusses their conclusions. Rösler is mentioned only once in the introduction, and yet her Negotium irenicum includes not just a wealth of translations but also a deeply perspicacious analysis of the rhetorical, theological, and philosophical underpinnings of Leibniz's irenic exchanges, which are the very topic of Backus' chapter 2. Antognazza shows up twice in the main text, only once in the footnotes (according to the index.) And yet Antognazza's monograph contains detailed analysis of topics related to Leibniz's metaphysics and epistemology of revelation that Backus also studies in her work, in particular in chapter 1.

Now, some justification for this strategy of evasion is provided, which brings me to my second complaint. By way of explaining her general approach, Backus presents herself as a "religious historian" and not a philosopher. And while she stresses that she has "read with much profit the work of present-day Anglo-Saxon philosophers who have written extensively on Leibniz's philosophy of religion," she also proclaims that she does not wish to "enter into competition with them" and instead focuses on "historical links" (p. 2). This is of course perfectly legitimate, but the problem is that she does not follow her own recommendation. She often embarks on analyses that one would be hard-pressed to qualify as unphilosophical and merely historical, such as grounding Leibniz's theological commitments in lengthy analyses of his metaphysics of substance, modal philosophy and phenomenalism, or engaging in detailed discussion of Leibniz's relations to other philosophers, including Descartes, Hobbes, Spinoza, Grotius and Newton. In reality, explaining Leibniz's theological commitments by reference to basic philosophical commitments (as opposed to theological beliefs or political aims) is a constant and very characteristic feature of Backus' overall approach. Hence, in spite of her professed wish to not "compete" with the historians of philosophy, this is nonetheless exactly what she does, invariably explaining the motivations behind Leibniz's theology in terms of his metaphysics -- in itself a strong interpretive choice that remains unjustified (and that this reviewer, at least, would strongly disagree with.) Furthermore, taking such an approach requires substantially deeper dialogue with the work of Antognazza and other philosophical commentators. This comes through as particularly problematic in the first and second parts of the book, where Backus is concerned with theological topics -- Leibniz's conception of the Eucharist and Predestination -- that have been extensively discussed among philosophers exactly because they have far-reaching consequences for the understanding of Leibniz's substance metaphysics and modal philosophy. This ambiguous strategy, backing off from philosophy in her explicit methodology while in fact embracing it on the deepest level of almost all her analyses, makes long sections of the book feel like neither fish nor fowl, as incursions of a religious historian into philosophical argument where undeniable historical and textual sophistication and superior knowledge of theology frequently give way to philosophical clumsiness.

To cite one particularly striking problem, when dealing with Leibniz's metaphysics of substance, Backus displays a curious lack of sensitivity to developmental aspects. To give just one example, one can refer to p. 14 where she, within the space of just a few lines, quotes both a 1668 letter to Jacob Thomasius and the 1714 Monadology as expressing one and the same conception of the soul as the form of the body! Presumably, such argumentation relies on an age-old but today hardly uncontested thesis regarding the continuity of Leibniz's substance metaphysics -- a thesis Backus simply stipulates in a matter-of-fact fashion a few pages earlier, proclaiming it "well-known that Leibniz first developed his concept of substance as a being which has a principle of action within itself around 1668" (p. 9), as if that concept was always one and the same from 1668 onward! The approach simply sweeps under the carpet thirty years of intense and widespread debate among Leibniz scholars on both sides of the Atlantic, including the work by Daniel Garber and Michel Fichant to mention the two most prominent among them, about the complex genesis of Leibniz's notions of substance, form, body and mind.

Finally, as an unessential but nonetheless important point, there are unfortunate editorial issues with the reference system and the cover of the publication that should not be imputed to Backus but rather to her publisher, Oxford University Press. The book's referencing system is impractical, an unfortunate result of choosing a complex system of endnotes while providing no simple way of correlating notes in the main text to the apparatus in the end.  Moreover, the publisher did not systematically verify the coherence of the system and made errors in typesetting, so that in at least one chapter -- chapter 6 -- the reference numbers do not correspond to the appropriate endnotes (see e.g. notes 29 and 32, which, respectively, should provide references to Hobbes and Spinoza or commentary about them, but in fact both refer to a website of the "Book of Concord," whereas the appropriate footnotes are numbered 30 and 34.) Moreover, the presentation on the cover -- I can only assume not written or verified by Backus herself -- contains errors and misinformation. For example, the cover blurb absurdly announces that the volume "offers the first study in over four hundred years [sic] that characterizes Leibniz as both a scholar and theologian." The same blurb moreover indicates that "Backus includes the first-ever translation of the Unvorgreiffliches Bedencken," a long key text on protestant church reunion that Leibniz co-wrote with Molanus around 1698-1704. Certainly, Backus indicates that her book was "sparked off partly by the publication" (p. 1) of that German text, which first appeared in 2011 in vol. 7, series IV, of the Academy edition. Moreover, she includes in an appendix a selection of related texts in English translation, mostly excerpts from Calvin and the Reformed Confession and some correspondence of Leibniz on Calvinism (p. 213-35). But there is no English translation of the Unvorgreiffliches Bedencken included in the monograph. Those interested in Leibniz and Molanus' co-written text, but who have not mastered German, may find help in the French translation contained in Rösler's published Negotium Irenicum (Rösler 2013: 893-1099).

In conclusion, I should stress that my various misgivings about Backus' book come with an important qualification: they should be considered in light of doubtless overblown expectations. While most of my concerns are not negligible, it is essential to add that Backus' work remains a remarkable addition to the literature and a must-read for anyone interested in Leibniz's theology. And I should highlight once again the deep interest and originality of the research on Leibniz and "sacred history" in the third part of the book.


Adams, Robert M. 1994. Leibniz: Determinist, Theist, Idealist. Oxford University Press.

Antognazza, Maria Rosa. 1999. Trinità e Incarnazione: Il rapport tra filosofia e teologia rivelata nel pensiero di Leibniz. Vita et Pensiero.

Antognazza, Maria Rosa. 2007. Leibniz on the Trinity and the Incarnation. Reason and Revelation in the Seventeenth Century. Yale University Press.

Baruzi, Jean. 1907. Leibniz et l'organisation religieuse de la terre. Félix Alcan.

Griffin, Michael. 2012. Leibniz, God and Necessity. Cambridge University Press.

Jablonski, Daniel Ernst, and Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz. 2013. Negotium Irenicum. L'union des Églises protestantes selon G. W. Leibniz and D. E. Jablonski, ed. C. Rösler-Le Van. Classiques Garnier.

Lærke, Mogens. 2015. Les Lumières de Leibniz. Controverses avec Huet, Bayle, Regis et More. Classiques Garnier.

Pichler, Alois. 1869-1870. Die Theologie des Leibniz, 2 vols. Gotta Buchhandlung.

Rösler, Claire. 2009. Negotium Irenicum. Les tentatives d'union des Eglises protestantes de G. W. Leibniz et de D. E. Jablonski, Ph.D.-dissertation, University of Paris IV, 14 February.