Leibniz Reinterpreted

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Lloyd Strickland, Leibniz Reinterpreted, Continuum Publishing, 2006, 172pp., $110.00 (hbk), ISBN 082649028X.

Reviewed by Laurence Carlin, University of Wisconsin Oshkosh


In the introductory chapter of Leibniz Reinterpreted, Lloyd Strickland writes that his object is to explain the most famous of all of Leibniz's claims: the actual world is the best possible world.  Strickland, of course, is not the first to attempt to interpret Leibniz's optimism, for as he acknowledges (p. 2), a plethora of commentators have attempted to do so over the years.  However, according to Strickland, "these previous efforts have all fallen somewhat wide of the mark" (p. 2), either because these treatments have been too brief -- "either in a journal article or a book chapter …  [and] such a short treatment cannot possibly succeed in doing it justice" (p. 2) -- or because "some of Leibniz's key pronouncements on this issue have been ignored, while other key texts have been misinterpreted, misread, or have had their meaning obscured by mistranslation" (p. 2).  The previous efforts referred to here include those of some of Leibniz's most respected commentators: David Blumenfeld, Gregory Brown, Donald Rutherford, Catherine Wilson, et al.  Thus, Strickland claims that some of Leibniz's best interpreters have systematically misunderstood his most famous doctrine.

Despite Strickland's express confidence that these scholars have been wrong -- one cannot help but notice Strickland's frequent use of the exclamation point (!) when criticizing their views -- the present reviewer doubts that Strickland's interpretation takes us in the right direction. In what follows, I summarize the remaining chapters of Strickland's book, note some of its virtues, and then argue against some of its main theses.

In chapter two, Strickland explains the general argument that Leibniz offered for his optimism. This involves interpreting Leibniz as a compatibilist with respect to divine agency, after which Strickland argues that according to Leibniz, the standards of worldly goodness are independent of the divine will. Having settled these matters, Strickland raises the question that presents itself next: what are the standards of worldly goodness?  This is the question to be addressed in the next several chapters, as it is tantamount to the question of what it means to say that this world is the best possible world (henceforth, BPW).

Chapter three continues the stage setting, as Strickland discusses the three kinds of Leibnizian perfection: metaphysical, physical, and moral perfection.  Strickland's analysis of the first type of perfection includes an account of how creatures obtain metaphysical perfection, an account that draws on Leibniz's Neo-Platonic sympathies.  Strickland's discussion of the other two types of perfection covers much of the same territory covered by other commentators, as it involves a general discussion of the connections between Leibnizian pleasure, happiness, virtue, and wisdom (and their opposites).  Strickland makes the preliminary claim here that according to Leibniz, the three types of perfection are not maximized in the BPW, contrary to what previous commentators have maintained.  This is a claim he promises to support in the chapters that follow, as he shifts focus from the perfection of things to the perfection of the BPW.

Chapters four and five form a unit, as the former chapter is on Leibniz's notion of richness, and the latter is on Leibnizian simplicity.  Together these chapters form an analysis of Leibniz's oft-repeated characterization of the BPW as "the one that is simultaneously the simplest in hypotheses and richest in phenomena." After a brief discussion of the history of plentitude (pp. 43f.), Strickland argues that Leibniz follows tradition to the extent he holds that God creates the greatest possible number of things (p. 47), as well as the greatest variety of kinds (species) of things (p. 49).  Moreover, this leads Leibniz to endorse the traditional view that there is no "vacuum of forms," i.e. there is a continuous hierarchical ordering of species in the universe (a "chain of being"), a hierarchy that serves the end of maximizing variety by leaving no "gaps" in the ordering of species. He argues that a number of commentators, the present reviewer included, were wrong to attribute to Leibniz the view that the law of continuity (Leibniz's favorite principle of worldly order) applies to the perfection of individuals.  That is, Strickland's Leibniz sees a continuous hierarchy of species, but not individuals within species (pp. 54f.).  Strickland is quick to point out, however, that for Leibniz this does not imply that every possible species exists, for not all possible species are compossible, i.e. not all of them can exist together.  So, Strickland argues that the richness of the BPW amounts to having the greatest number and variety of compossible things, and this is attained by God's selecting the fullest chain of continuously ordered species.

As for the simplicity criterion of the BPW, Strickland again parts ways with previous commentators and argues that for Leibniz, there is a distinction between God's "ways" and his "laws," and that "simplicity" applies only to God's ways or "means" or "actions," not (primarily, at least) to laws.  According to Strickland, "this distinction has been overlooked by just about every commentator, [and] …  [t]his has led to some rather peculiar mistakes" (p. 69f.).  However, since Leibniz unhelpfully applies the term "simple" to both laws and God's ways, Strickland suggests that we understand simplicity with respect to God's ways as meaning "that God establishes the smallest possible number of laws," (p. 69), i.e. God uses "the fewest number of decrees" (p. 148).  And he suggests that we understand Leibniz's conception of laws in the BPW as exhibiting "universality," "uniformity," and mathematical "simplicity" (p. 70). The remainder of chapter five is dedicated primarily to three goals: to show that the interpretations of Gale and Rescher (which date back more than three decades) are "fatally flawed" (p. 71); to show that Leibniz did not have a Malebranchean conception of "fecund" laws; and to explain Leibniz's view that God finds an "efficient algorithm" in order "to fit together the maximum number of compossible things in such a way as to fill the world to its capacity" (p. 80).  Thus, God's simple (i.e. few) ways (i.e. decrees) bring about "excellent" (universal, etc.) laws that govern the richest compossible composite.  He also provides an interesting discussion of how he believes the latter conception of the BPW is connected with Leibniz's alternative characterization of the BPW as the one that involves "the greatest amount of essence" (p. 84ff.).

In chapter six, Strickland turns to a discussion of harmony, as Leibniz often characterized the BPW as the most harmonious world.  Strickland follows others in attributing to Leibniz a Neo-Platonist interpretation of that notion.  According to Strickland, Leibniz's notion of harmony is the key to unlocking his doctrine of compossibility (a doctrine that has eluded some of Leibniz's best commentators):

[H]armony determines what is and is not compossible; in fact 'compossible' just means 'is harmonious with'.  So if A is compossible with B, then A is harmonious with B. (p. 110; Strickland's emphasis).

Strickland is led to this conclusion through a long chain of reasoning about which I will comment below.

Finally, chapter seven addresses the question of whether the world increases in perfection.  This chapter includes useful discussions of Leibniz on salvation, among other topics. Chapter eight is helpful, as it provides a much-needed summary of Strickland's conclusions.  One of the major points of disagreement here between Strickland and others concerns the degree to which physical and moral perfection are present in the BPW for Leibniz.  According to Strickland, these types of perfection are not at a maximum in the universe, as previous commentators have claimed.

Leibniz Reinterpreted exhibits a number of strengths.  It is clearly written, and the organization of the book is stellar, for its initial entry into the topic and its subsequent order of discussion lead the reader in a logical progression.  In this respect, it would serve as a fitting introduction for the reader unfamiliar with Leibniz's optimism.  Moreover, Strickland is obviously familiar with a broad range of Leibniz's writings, many of which are not available in English, and he draws on a number of Leibniz's lesser-known excerpts in a way that helps to illuminate a number of Leibnizian topics.

However, it seems to this reviewer that most of the interpretations offered in the book have been offered already by others and so do not contribute as much novelty as Strickland seems to suggest.  And where he does offer novelty and attempts to show that previous commentators were wrong, Strickland ignores texts that seem clearly to challenge his interpretation.  While there are many instances of this in the book, in the limited space available I will focus my attention on certain crucial components of Strickland's interpretation.

Recall that Strickland argues that previous commentators overstate the use to which Leibniz puts his famous law of continuity.  Specifically, Strickland argues that although Leibniz believed there was no vacuum of species, he denied that the law of continuity governed the series of individual substances with respect to varying degrees of perfection.  Many of us have maintained that Leibniz's use of the principle of continuity is sweeping, as it applies to any ordering in the Leibnizian universe.  While discussing previous commentators' claims that Leibniz recognized a continuous ordering of perfection with respect to all existing individual substances, Strickland expresses what appears to be total exasperation that any commentator should have held such a view.  Strickland finds it "somewhat unnecessary" even to correct Rutherford's "odd" interpretive move (p. 55).  Bertrand Russell made the same mistake in a "mysterious" way; the present reviewer's reading "will not stand up to scrutiny" (p. 56).  And with respect to Nicholas Rescher, Strickland writes: "How he would propose to justify this I cannot even guess" (p. 55).

Pace Strickland, there is significant evidence that Leibniz held the law of continuity to be as sweeping as many of us have maintained.  Strickland promises (p. 56) that it will "become clear" why "it was not open" to Leibniz to accept a continuous ordering of degrees of perfection, but as far as the present reviewer can tell, it never becomes clear.  The point is worth emphasizing, since it has far-reaching consequences for understanding Leibniz, and for Strickland's interpretation of the Leibnizian BPW.

To begin, Leibniz often characterized the law of continuity as a "general one," a "principle of general order" (GP III, 51/L 351; Leibniz's emphasis)[1] that obtains in the world, which might lead one to believe it is without exception.  So far as I am aware, Leibniz never mentions a single worldly ordering that is not continuous.  Indeed, his remarks point in just the opposite direction: "But continuity is found in time, extension, qualities, movement -- in fact, in all natural changes, for these never take place by leaps" (L 671). In one passage from the New Essays, Leibniz makes the point particularly explicit:

I believe that the universe contains everything that its perfect harmony could admit. It is agreeable to this harmony that between creatures which are far removed from one another there should be intermediate creatures, though not always on a single planet or in a single [planetary] system; and sometimes a thing is intermediate between two species in some respects and not in others. Birds, so different from man in other ways, approach him by virtue of their speech, but if monkeys could speak as parrots can, they would approach him even more closely. The Law of Continuity holds that nature leaves no gap in the orderings which she follows, but not every form or species belongs to each ordering. (NE 307)

It is clear that Leibniz is here maintaining that in this universe (i.e. the one which contains "perfect harmony"), even orderings of speech capability are continuous.  Curiously, in arguing against this reading, Strickland quotes only the last sentence of the above passage, and argues that the present reviewer's interpretation must be wrong.  Of course, if one focused only on the last sentence, Strickland's criticism might seem on target: "It is doubtful that Leibniz would have recognized the law of continuity as applying to apparently arbitrary orderings such as that of speech capability," for "if he did, then he would have presumably have had to accept continuity of … many other orderings too ludicrous to mention" (p. 65).  But if we read the passage in context, as we ought, Leibniz's point strikes with utter clarity, regardless of how "ludicrous" we might find it.

Other considerations show that continuity applies to more orderings than Strickland allows, and lead one to suspect that his characterization of the BPW was not Leibniz's.  In chapter five, Strickland discusses Leibniz's claim that in the BPW, God fits as much being as possible into the world in such a way that there is no vacuum.  Rutherford has suggested that the way to do this is to adhere to the principle of continuity: God fills every space with a degree of perfection by aligning things continuously (i.e. by following the principle of continuity) with respect to degree of perfection. Strickland, on the other hand, argues that God must find what he calls an "efficient algorithm," one that uses the fewest decrees in order to fill every space with a degree of perfection, but not a continuously ordered succession of degrees of perfection.  Given that Leibniz loved continuous orderings, and that a continuous ordering would clearly maximize variety and leave no gaps, why didn't Strickland's Leibniz employ it? Part of the answer, according to Strickland, is that Leibniz did not discover the law of continuity until the mid-1680s (p. 90), after his claim (to Malebranche) that simple laws are necessary to squeeze as many things together in creation as possible.  However, it is well known that Leibniz was engaged in studies of continuity as early as the early 1670s.  Another answer is this: "Leibniz nowhere suggests that the law of continuity has a role in the origin of the world" (p. 90).  It is not entirely clear what Strickland has in mind here, for if the law of continuity governs orderings in nature, it would certainly seem to play a role in the actualization of nature.  Moreover, Strickland had already argued (p. 50) that the law of continuity plays a significant role in creation, viz., when it comes to the continuity of species.  In any event, as we have seen, Leibniz repeatedly labels the law of continuity a law of "general order," and Leibniz often employed this last label in the context of divine creative decisions.  He writes to Arnauld about how "each possible world depends … upon certain primary free decrees or laws of the general order" (LA 57).  It would appear, then, that principles of general order, such as the law of continuity, are indeed on Leibniz's mind when it comes to creation. 

But notice that this passage to Arnauld also undercuts another major component of Strickland's interpretation, for Leibniz here seems to identify God's decrees (ways) with laws of "general order" that obtain in the universe. This is directly at odds with Strickland's claim that commentators have failed to separate God's decrees from God's laws (p. 69f.).  Curiously, Leibniz's famous law of the general order is not even mentioned in Strickland's book, despite Leibniz's insistence that it is the law that dictates the overarching universal design in the BPW (cf. Discourse on Metaphysics §7).  And when it comes to Leibniz's repeated claim that God's ways are a part of the BPW, Strickland would have us understand that Leibniz is here referring to God's decrees that are part of the BPW, and not the laws of order.  But in what sense could the actual decrees be a part of the product, the BPW, if they are not themselves laws?  Thus, both Strickland's claim that commentators have overstated Leibniz's use of the principle of continuity, and his claim that commentators have overlooked a crucial distinction (one which leads to "peculiar mistakes" [p. 70]) between ways (decrees) and laws seem implausible. 

There are other contentious claims in Strickland's book.  I suspect that his claim that compossibility amounts to harmony, i.e. "that 'compossible' just means 'is harmonious with'" (p. 110) will be met with some resistance.  For one thing, the reasoning that leads him to this conclusion involves a number of distinctions that are simply not present in Leibniz's writings (e.g. "temporal" vs. "atemporal" degrees of perfection [p. 108]).  It also requires him to add words of substantial ontological import to Leibniz's own (e.g. "when Leibniz states that 'no two essences are equally perfect' he should be understood as saying that no two possible things are equally perfect" [p. 108]).  Moreover, it is not at all obvious that Leibniz's definition of compossible (which again, is curiously omitted by Strickland) -- "what, when taken with another, does not imply a contradiction" (Grua 325) -- meshes with Strickland's analysis; for, as far as I know, Leibniz does not suggest that when two things fail to harmonize, a "contradiction" is implied.

[1] I employ the following abbreviations when citing Leibniz' texts:


GP = Die Philosophischen Schriften von Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz, ed. C.I. Gerhardt (Berlin: Weidman, 1875-1890), 7 vols., cited by volume and page.


Grua = Textes Inédits, ed. Gaston Grua (Paris: Presses Universitaires de France, 1948).


L = Philosophical Papers and Letters, ed. Leroy Loemker, 2nd ed. (Dordrecht: Reidel, 1969).


NE = New Essays on Human Understanding, trans. and eds. Peter Remnant and Jonathon Bennett (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1982).