Leibniz's Metaphysics and Adoption of Substantial Forms: Between Continuity and Transformation

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Adrian Nita (ed.), Leibniz's Metaphysics and Adoption of Substantial Forms: Between Continuity and Transformation, Springer, 2015, 176pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789401799553.

Reviewed by Julia Jorati, The Ohio State University


When presenting his new system to the public in a 1695 journal article, Leibniz claimed that he was originally attracted to a purely mechanistic view of the world. Yet, he soon came to realize that it was "impossible to find the principles of a true unity in matter alone" and that it was "necessary to restore and as it were rehabilitate the substantial forms that are so often denounced today" (Gerhardt, Die Philosophischen Schriften, 4:478f.). Substantial forms are central to Aristotelianism -- widely accepted in medieval Europe -- according to which material substances consist of matter and an organizing principle that is called 'form.' These forms are supposed to account for the substance's existence or actuality, to make the substance the kind of thing that it is, and to specify the properties, activities, and powers that are proper to a substance of that kind. Leibniz is not exaggerating when he says that substantial forms were often denounced in his time: many prominent early modern scientists and philosophers not only rejected the Aristotelian account of substance emphatically but even ridiculed it. The fact that Leibniz claims to rehabilitate substantial forms, then, is quite remarkable. It also gives rise to a number of questions. In what ways, for instance, do Leibnizian substantial forms differ from their Aristotelian counterparts? What roles precisely do they play in Leibniz's metaphysics during different portions of his career? And what is their relation to monads? Adrian Nita's volume, which mainly contains papers that were presented at a conference in Bucharest in 2013, explores some of these questions. Its chief focus is on Leibniz's reasons for adopting substantial forms in the late 1670s and on the role they play in Leibniz's metaphysics thereafter.

As is often the case with conference volumes, the chapters vary in quality and do not cover all of the aspects that one would include in a systematic treatment of the subject matter. In fact, the volume simultaneously exhibits too much and not enough thematic unity: some chapters overlap significantly while others have little or no connection to each other or to the volume's theme. This problem is compounded by the fact that the thematic focus of the volume is not very well defined. On the back cover, the book is described as being about "a very important part of the philosophical work of the young Leibniz." The editor's introduction likewise concentrates mainly on Leibniz's views in the 1660s and '70s as well as on his reasons for introducing substantial forms in that early period, and one of the contributors implies that the theme of the volume is the early Leibniz (60). Yet several of the chapters focus on Leibniz's middle and late years, which in combination with the volume's title suggests that the thematic focus is supposed to be not just Leibniz's initial adoption of substantial forms but also later transformations of his views on substance. Even this broader understanding, however, does not encompass all of the contributions. Despite these flaws, the volume contains first-rate scholarship that unquestionably deserves to be taken seriously by historians of early modern metaphysics. I learned something from each chapter and predict that a number of them will have a lasting impact on Leibniz studies.

Nita's brief introduction aims to frame the volume's central concerns by making a few general remarks about Leibniz's relationship to scholasticism and highlighting some of the major developments in his early theory of substance. As already noted, Nita concentrates almost exclusively on writings from the 1660s and '70s, mentioning later texts only in passing and mainly to shed light on why Leibniz adopted substantial forms in the first place.

In chapter two -- the first after the editor's introduction -- Lucio Mare and Roger Ariew explore the developments in Leibniz's views on individuation from 1663 to 1686 and therefore, indirectly, Leibniz's attitude toward substantial forms during those years. They point out that at the end of the period under consideration, Leibniz accounts for individuation by combining three strategies that were traditionally viewed as separate and even competing. The first is the Thomist strategy for individuating immaterial substances through their substantial forms or lowest species. The second is the Scotist strategy, which individuates substances through haecceities or "thisnesses." Haecceities are usually considered to be non-qualitative properties, but Leibniz transforms them first into external spatio-temporal determinations and then into qualitative intrinsic properties, according to the authors. The third, final strategy is the individuation of substances through complete concepts, that is, through the entirety of their intrinsic properties. Mare and Ariew trace the convoluted and intriguing path that takes Leibniz from his 1663 bachelor's thesis, in which he argues that things are individuated through their whole entity, to his 1680s combination of the three traditionally distinct strategies.

In the third chapter Nita explores an apparent change in Leibniz's discussions of the unity and identity of substances: while he initially portrays the principle of unity and individuation as something mind-like, he later portrays it as something soul-like. In investigating these issues, Nita goes over some of the same material as Mare and Ariew do, namely Leibniz's writings from the 1660s and '70s about individuation. Nita adds a discussion of the importance of unity and activity for Leibniz's theory of substance and an exploration of the above-mentioned shift between likening substantial forms to minds and likening them to souls. This shift, according to Nita, is significant because Leibniz typically reserves the term 'mind' for rational souls.

In the fourth chapter, Stefano Di Bella focuses on another role that substantial forms play in Leibniz's system, namely, accounting for the temporal unity or transtemporal identity of substances. After providing some context by briefly discussing Aristotle's and Hobbes's accounts of transtemporal identity, Di Bella argues that Leibniz adopts substantial forms mainly because of two perceived shortcomings of the Cartesian theory of body. The first shortcoming has to do with the laws of physics: to correctly describe the interaction of bodies, we need the notions of force or power, which go beyond Cartesian extension since they involve "an essential reference to a future effect" (47). The second shortcoming is metaphysical: the Cartesian picture cannot account for the identity of bodies through change. Introducing substantial forms can kill both of these shortcomings with one stone, so to speak. Forms or mind-like entities can contain references to future and past states, which in turn makes it possible not only to ascribe instantaneous forces to bodies but also to account for a body's identity through change.

Enrico Pasini's contribution is an extended exploration of an intriguing rhetorical question from a 1678 letter by Leibniz: "Who would ever reject substantial forms, that is to say, the essential differences of the bodies?" (A 2.1.604). Pasini is particularly interested in the question of why Leibniz would describe substantial forms as the essential differences of bodies. To answer that question, he first examines how the expression differentia essentialis was employed in medieval philosophy, arguing that it was used to describe differences in substantial form or lowest species. Any angel, according to Aquinas and Suárez, has a unique substantial form and therefore differs essentially from any other angel. Some philosophers, for instance William of Auvergne, even hold that there are essential differences between two individuals of the same lowest species, such as between two horses. It is plausible, Pasini contends, that this is also what Leibniz means because he famously holds that each individual substance has a different substantial form and thus belongs, in a sense, to a different lowest species.

In chapter six Markku Roinila explores the theory of affects that Leibniz presents in his unpublished 1679 text "De affectibus." According to Roinila, Leibniz had already come to reject the Cartesian account of the relation between mind and body and in particular the Cartesian theory of actions and passions. "De affectibus" is an attempt to replace Descartes's account with something less problematic. One important point of departure from Descartes is that for Leibniz, passions are not caused by the body but instead arise in the mind, though occasioned by perceptions of external objects. In addition, Leibniz understands mental activity as consisting in law-governed, continuous sequences of thoughts, aiming at some desired good and originating in some affect of pleasure or pain. This process, moreover, is not purely mechanistic but is based on forces, powers, and inclinations. Roinila stresses that Leibniz's account nevertheless appears to be influenced in some respects by Hobbes, who also talks about series of thoughts in the mind and who develops a mechanistic theory of the affects that is based on basic desires to avoid pain and to attain pleasure. One thing that Leibniz adds to this Hobbesian picture is the claim that pleasure is a sense of perfection or harmony.

In chapter seven, Andreas Blank discusses the ways in which Leibniz employs the legal notion 'presumption' in his philosophy of action. His paper, though enormously interesting and valuable, has no straightforward connections to substantial forms as far as I am able to tell. In the legal tradition, 'presumption' is used in a number of different -- albeit related -- ways. For instance, a person who has been missing for a long time is presumed dead, and a defendant is presumed innocent until proven guilty. The term is also used to describe conjectures that are based on the preponderance of evidence. Leibniz employs the term even more broadly. For him, according to Blank, there is generally a presumption in favor of what happens more easily. For instance, if we can see in the present state of a thing a potency or inclination toward a future state, we should presume that this future state will occur. Leibniz defines easiness, in turn, through his notion of requisites or conditions of existence: something occurs or exists more easily the fewer requisites it has. As a result, there is generally an ontological presumption for that which has fewer requisites than its opposite. Interestingly, Blank argues, this implies that there is a sense in which it is easier for something to be possible than impossible, and that in turn implies -- because Leibniz sometimes defines justice in modal terms -- that there is a general presumption that an action is just.

In chapter eight (the only contribution, apparently, not presented at the Bucharest conference) Paul Lodge discusses the status of corporeal substances in Leibniz's mature metaphysics. He examines the controversial question of whether there is room in Leibniz's mature views for corporeal substances, that is, for substances that are composed of a soul and a body, analogous to Aristotelian form and matter. Some interpreters have argued that it is Leibniz's considered view in the mature years that there cannot be corporeal substances because the only genuine substances are monads or simple substances. A composite of a central monad or soul and a body consisting of subordinate monads is an aggregate and cannot strictly speaking count as a substance, on that interpretation. Lodge disagrees. He shows through a meticulous analysis of the relevant texts that it is not at all clear that Leibniz views soul-body composites as aggregates. While the body, viewed in isolation from the soul, is a mere aggregate, the soul or dominant monad can plausibly confer a per se unity on the composite and turn it into something that is not an aggregate but rather a genuine substance.

In the ninth chapter Pauline Phemister examines the role that souls or substantial forms play in Leibniz's theory of preformation. For Leibniz, plants and animals do not come into existence in the natural course of events; rather, they develop gradually from smaller organisms, that is, from tiny preformed seeds that God created when he created the world. Phemister aims to answer the question of why, given that Leibniz appears to provide a completely mechanistic account of the development of organisms from their seeds, he nevertheless insists that this process requires the presence of substantial forms or souls in these seeds. She contrasts Leibniz with Malebranche, who holds that preformation can explain the development of organisms unaided by souls. Why would Leibniz insist on the need for souls? Phemister's answer is that it is a prerequisite of Leibnizian pre-formation that the future is already included in the present state, which can ultimately happen only through perception and hence souls. Indeed, she adds, causation requires the presence of a soul in the effect that represents the entirety of its causes. Hence, an organism can only develop from a seed whose soul contains its entire history, that is, all past and future states.

In the penultimate chapter, Richard T.W. Arthur aims to show that one of Leibniz's motivations for adopting substantial forms is the worry that motion would otherwise be a mere phenomenon. That this was Leibniz's motivation in turn constitutes evidence against a phenomenalist interpretation of Leibniz, he contends. Arthur cites passages in which Leibniz argues against a purely mechanistic picture and in favor of primitive forces or substantial forms by pointing out that real motion requires introducing the latter and therefore rejecting the former. Since space is relative, a mere change of situation is not sufficient for determining which body is in motion. We need to know, in addition, which body is the cause of the change of situation. According to Arthur, there is excellent evidence that Leibniz views motion -- even in the mature period -- as a well-founded phenomenon rather than as a mere phenomenon; its reality consists in force, that is, in the appetitions of the monads in the moving body. As a result, Leibniz claims that motion is, as it were, a secondary quality: it is the way in which the forces of external things appear to us. This theory of motion, Arthur insists, undermines phenomenalist interpretations.

The final chapter is by Daniel Garber and examines the radical changes in Leibniz's views on substance in the second half of the 1690s. The chapter supplements and partially revises the account of these changes that Garber provides in his influential monograph Leibniz: Body, Substance, Monad (Oxford University Press, 2009) by exploring some newly available texts. In the period under consideration, Garber argues, Leibniz moves from a view on which extended, corporeal, hylomorphic substances are the grounds of all reality to a view on which that role is occupied by unextended, mind-like monads. By means of a painstaking analysis of texts -- including letters to Rabener, Behrens, and Wagner -- Garber investigates how and when precisely Leibniz adopts the monadological picture that is familiar from later works.