Leibniz's Metaphysics: Its Origins and Development

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Mercer, Christia, Leibniz's Metaphysics: Its Origins and Development, Cambridge University Press, 2001, xiii + 528pp., $80 (hbk), ISBN 0-521-40301-4.

Reviewed by Philip Beeley, University of Munster, Germany


Although Leibniz in later years sometimes describes his youthful works such as the Dissertatio de arte combinatoria (166) and the Hypothesis physica nova (1671) with a certain embarrassment as “lightweight juvenilia”, there can be little doubt that his early philosophy was an important part of a development leading up to his mature position represented by the doctrine of monads. Indeed, this has been convincingly shown by a number of monographs on the young Leibniz published in recent years which have sought to continue the tradition of scholarship established at the beginning of the last century by Arthur Hannequin and Willy Kabitz.

All previous commentators have acknowledged that a number of features of the mature metaphysics are already to be found scattered in the earlier writings. Among these are the concept that there are worlds within worlds into infinity and the systematic importance given to the concept of harmony. Nevertheless, following Leibniz’s own accounts of his philosophical development, they were agreed that at the age of fifteen or sixteen he rejected the scholasticism he had previously imbued for a modern approach to understanding nature, and that in subsequent years he tried out a variety of mechanistic models, including the atomism of Gassendi, before in the mid to late 1670s deciding to re-introduce the substantial forms he had earlier cast aside. Leibniz’s philosophical development during this time was considered to be principally, but not exclusively, motivated by questions related to mechanism. The image which emerged was that of a young man whose philosophy was driven by scientific interests while at the same time seeking to reconcile the modern approach with traditional teachings including those of Christianity. In short, the young Leibniz was certainly not first and foremost a metaphysician.

Christia Mercer’s long-awaited book seeks to bring about a radical change to our previous perceptions. Claiming to provide “the first systematic account of Leibniz’s philosophical development” (p. 1), she criticizes her predecessors for having placed scientifically orientated mechanistic philosophy at the center of Leibniz’s interests and emphasizes instead the fundamental importance of theological considerations, arguing that “his first systematic metaphysics “was directed toward an ecumenical goal” (p. 64).

A considerable amount of the book is given over to explaining how in Mercer’s view scholars have previously failed to recognize the true nature of the developmental story. Part of the problem she ascribes to Leibniz himself, who typically neither states his most basic assumptions nor articulates how the piece on which he is presently working fits into the general scheme of things. For their part, scholars have neglected to take the widest possible textual perspective when approaching the early philosophy and have then capitulated in the face of the seeming disunity of some of the doctrines Leibniz proposes: “many scholars have concluded that there is little or no relation among [the texts] and hence that there is no underlying theory of substance” (p. 14). This problem is in her view reflected in the interpretation of Bertrand Russell and Louis Couturat, whose answer was to provide a logical deduction of the Monadology from a small number of premises. One of the aims which Mercer pursues is to disprove once and for all the Russell-Couturat interpretation from an historical point of view by showing that the account of truth on which it depends is nowhere to be found among papers written between 1668 and 1676. It was, in her opinion, precisely during this time that Leibniz came to develop the key features of his metaphysics.

The book is divided into four parts, supplemented by two appendixes (“First Truths” and “Leibniz’s Original Assumptions”), an extensive bibliography and an index locorum. In the first part, entitled “Metaphysics of Method”, she argues that Leibniz, in responding to the political, religious, and philosophical chaos he found around him, developed a conciliatory methodology. Adopting the fundamental eclecticism of his teachers Jakob Thomasius and Johann Adam Scherzer, Leibniz sought to combine the new mechanistic philosophy with the traditional teachings of Aristotle. This was only part of a general tendency which turns out to be characteristic for Leibniz’s approach; he was, as Mercer writes, “a collector of ideas”, who was successful in building “an original and sublime philosophical edifice out of recycled materials “ (p.53).

Part 2 (“Metaphysics of Substance”) contains in many ways the most crucial arguments of Leibniz’s Metaphysics. Here, Mercer suggests that the young philosopher’s ecumenical goal led him first of all to tackle some of the most recalcitrant theological problems including the possibility of mysteries such as the Eucharist and the demonstration of the existence of God. Against this background, she discovers evidence that Leibniz already in 1668-69 found himself required to reject the conception of body as res extensa and to re-introduce substantial forms – a good ten years earlier than scholars have previously believed. Part of the reason for Leibniz’s move was, she argues, his recognition that the foundations of mechanistic philosophy were metaphysically inadequate. While at first God was postulated as the direct source of motion, Leibniz soon found it necessary to add mind to body, thus effectively creating already at this time a concept of corporeal substances, similar to that which his teacher Thomasius had postulated. Over the next two years this “conciliatory metaphysics of substance” (p.129) takes on a more definite form. Of decisive importance in this respect was, in Mercer’s view, Leibniz’s departure from an initial limitation of this substantial union to human beings. He soon came to devise a model of nature composed of corporeal substances in which each active principle contains a “set of instructions” and is permanently connected to a passive principle “through which it always acts” (p.152). According to what she calls “Leibniz’s second theory of corporeal substance”, each mind or substantial form is the active principle in corporeal substance. On her view, this theory finds its completed form in Leibniz’s two complementary tracts on motion of 1671, the Hypothesis physica nova and the Theoria motus abstracti, where the young philosopher, influenced among others by Hobbes’s concept of endeavor (conatus), came to reject the real extension of passive primary matter and to turn “the passive principle in corporeal substance into a collection of mind-like substances” (p.158).

Part 3 is devoted to the “Metaphysics of Divinity”. Here, Mercer articulates what she sees as the precise relation between God and creatures, namely that the supreme Being emanates its power and essence into each substance as a created thing. Finding the roots of this concept in the Platonist tradition nurtured by Leibniz’s teachers at the University of Leipzig, Mercer provides a twenty-page summary of those doctrines she considers to constitute the material which Leibniz incorporated into his own position, such as the concept of the underlying harmony of all beings and the view that God maintains everything in the world through emanation. By means of the latter, she additionally seeks to show that something close to the complete concept theory of substance of Leibniz’s mature philosophy is already present in the writings of the early 1670s.

In Part 4, which is simply entitled “Metaphysics”, Mercer sketches what she considers to be the final stages of Leibniz’s early development up to the end of the 1670s, arguing that already at the beginning of the decade central doctrines of his mature thought, such as the system of pre-established harmony had been invented. Precisely here she finds further evidence for the methodology ascribed to Leibniz in Part 1, since this system “handsomely combines” in her view “Platonist assumptions about unity and diversity […] with Aristotelian assumptions about causal self-sufficiency” (p.378). The image she thereby creates is one of a philosophy which at root is a patchwork of the views and concepts of others. As she writes in the Conclusion, for Leibniz the road to truth was paved with the books of great philosophers. For this reason “he collected ideas from the prominent philosophical traditions and then attempted to combine them in a way that would solve all the problems, and please everyone” (p.471).

Taken as a whole, Leibniz’s Metaphysics is a significant contribution to our understanding of the young Leibniz. Mercer has succeeded in unearthing many hitherto obscure metaphysical assumptions which are surely present in his early philosophy. She is particularly to be congratulated for her acute analyses of theological writings which previous scholars working on the period have tended to ignore. From this point of view her findings not only add to our knowledge of the questions he was concerned with at the time, but also are likely to initiate further fruitful discussion on the precise nature of Leibniz’s philosophical development.

However, the reviewer suspects, as no doubt many other readers will do, that in her keenness to situate the beginnings of Leibniz’s doctrine of monads in the early period, Mercer has on occasion gone far beyond what the available texts are able to offer. This is most clearly evident in respect of the “second theory of material substance”, on which many of her later conclusions depend. The decisive concept here is that of momentary mind (mens momentanea), which Leibniz introduces in his Theoria motus abstracti as part of his efforts to explicate the distinction between mind and body – something which he on many occasions claims to have done more successfully than any philosopher before. Adapting the Hobbesian concept of the “infinitesimal” beginning of motion or endeavor, Leibniz in 1670-71 finds the distinguishing factor to be that while such endeavors in the mind are retained indefinitely – this explains both memory and the mental initiation of action qua motion –, endeavors in body have only a fleeting or momentary existence. Leibniz’s definition of bodies as momentary minds effectively enables him to turn Hobbes’s materialism upside down. This was something of enormous importance not just in view of Leibniz’s consistent efforts to show that modern philosophy was reconcilable with Christian teachings, but also in respect of the very real dangers which materialism was seen to represent. We should not forget that in 1666 the English Parliament passed a resolution in which the disaster of the Great Fire was blamed among others on the views espoused by the author of Leviathan and that Leibniz presented his two tracts on motion in the first instance to the Royal Society in London and then somewhat later to the Académie Royale des Sciences in Paris.

For Leibniz, bodies simply are defined as “momentary minds”, they are transient in the sense that they are constantly changing and that they have no memory. Mercer, however, interprets Leibniz in the Theoria motus abstracti to mean that passive primary matter in corporeal substance – a concept, incidentally, which does not even occur in the tract – is itself a collection of “mind-like substances” (p.158). Just a few pages later she describes momentary mind as “the active principle in a […] corporeal substance” (p.164). Notwithstanding the contradictions in Mercer’s exposition, Leibniz would scarcely have been able to make the claim he did if he had made body simply a collection of minds – quite apart from the fact that what Mercer calls “panorganic vitalism” (p.281) would have been most unlikely to have found favor among the members of the two foremost scientific institutions of the day.

One of the other consequences of Mercer’s approach is that she fails to acknowledge the importance which Leibniz already in his youth attached to explicating the nature of human thought. And this is surely also part of his metaphysics, stretching from investigations on the combination of concepts in De arte combinatoria through the geometrical model of 1671 to extensive work on universal character from 1675-76 onward, where he began to recognize the possibilities of a system of symbols similar to those used in algebra for understanding and perfecting human thought. Throughout his life, Leibniz was convinced that human minds are something like metaphysical images of the divine mind. Precisely for this reason scientific disquisitions which involve the investigation of pure concepts such as numbers or the geometrical continuum are just as much a part of gaining insight into God as more overt metaphysical investigations. For no other reason than this does Leibniz see the ultimate purpose of his pure treatment of motion in Theoria motus abstracti as furnishing us with “solid demonstrations of God and the mind”, while the investigations of the Hypothesis physica nova provide an explanation for how pure theory is applied to nature in order to increase the power and happiness of the human race, this being “the sole end of philosophy”. In short, it is to say the least problematic when dealing with Leibniz to ascribe pre-eminence to theology in his thought or to declare that his “most basic philosophical views evolved in an attempt to solve specific theological problems” (p. 2). Physical considerations were just as much an essential part of his philosophical development as were legal, metaphysical, and theological considerations. His various fields of activity are all intimately related, and all contributed to each other.

If, for this reason, it seems to be fundamentally wrong to ascribe Leibniz’s scientific activity only a subsidiary role in his philosophical development, as Mercer does, she is nevertheless to be applauded for her thought-provoking book, which provides important new evidence for Platonist roots to Leibniz’s early thought. She has succeeded admirably in piecing together an important part of the metaphysical story, which, as becomes clear reading Leibniz’s Metaphysics, we previously knew only half as well.