Leibniz's Mill: A Challenge to Materialism

Placeholder book cover

Charles Landesman, Leibniz's Mill: A Challenge to Materialism, University of Notre Dame Press, 2011, 175pp., $30.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780268034115.

Reviewed by William Hasker, Huntington University


Clearly enough, materialism is the dominant view of the mind in contemporary philosophy. It's also true, however, that seemingly intractable difficulties have emerged, resulting not only in a profusion of varieties of materialism but in a number of books embodying challenges to materialism and advocat­ing a variety of non-materialist alternatives. Recent examples include The Waning of Materialism, ed. Koons and Bealer (Oxford 2010), The Soul Hypothesis: Investigations into the Existence of the Soul, ed. Baker and Goetz (Continuum 2011), and Irreducibly Conscious: Selected Papers on Conscious­ness, ed. Batthyany and Elitzur (Universitätsverlag Winter 2009). Judging by the title, one would expect Charles Landesman's book to be another instance of this genre -- and this is correct, but only to a degree. More on this later, after we have reviewed the book's contents.

The first chapter, "Body and Mind," begins with a fairly detailed review of Descartes's argu­ment in the Meditations. (Landesman contends that "the current metaphysical materialism has failed to extirpate the dualism that Descartes so brilliantly placed upon the agenda of modern philosophy over three centuries ago" (4).) He then reviews two of Gassendi's objections to Descartes, each of which he finds inconclusive. However, he rejects as implausible Descartes's contention that "the unextended self is capable of becoming aware of the corporeal image in the brain," because "there is no reason to suppose that when a person sees a red object, there is actually a red patch located in the brain" (15). (This topic is pursued further in the fourth chapter.) Landesman then proceeds to an examination of Leibniz's mill (from the Monadology): Leibniz claimed that if we imagined the brain (conceived as a physical machine) enlarged so that "we could enter it, as one enters into a mill … we will find only parts that push one another, and we will never find anything to explain a perception" (20). This anti-materialist argument, Landesman claims, has never been refuted. He considers and answers several recent objections to the argument. But he fails to underscore what I take to be Leibniz's most telling point: consciousness cannot be an attribute of a material object, because it is impossible for a complex state of consciousness to exist distributed among the parts of a complex object such as the brain: "And so," said Leibniz, "we should seek perceptions in the simple substance and not in the composite or the machine" (20). A missed opportunity here, I think! The chapter concludes with reflections on consciousness and the subjective point of view.

The second chapter, "Other Minds," begins with a presentation of that problem, which leads to a review of epistemological issues concerning knowledge and belief, reliabilism, and skepticism. In the light of this review, Landesman proposes an inductivist response to the other minds problem. Contrary to Wittgenstein, it is not irresponsible to generalize from one's own case; it is perfectly reasonable to assume that others have in their own boxes beetles resembling one's own! Later on, Landesman considers Reid's doctrine of "natural signs" as an alternative to the inductivist account; he does not come down squarely in favor of one in preference to the other.

The third chapter, "Self-Consciousness and Thought," explores some of the issues arising from Descartes's use of the cogito; included are self-knowledge, self-consciousness, and the nature of the self as substance. He considers and rejects claims that the self is an illusion, and he discusses at some length the issues surrounding personal identity. He concludes that

our understanding of personal identity as revealed in the way we resolve doubts in actual cases is consistent with the Cartesian picture, and the fact that the self is prior to the body in the ways indicated suggests that our sense of identity actually supports the Cartesian picture. (96)

Chapter 4, on "Perceptual Consciousness," is the longest in the book. Landesman introduces the issue by expounding Moore's claim in "The Refutation of Idealism" that whenever we are aware of anything (for example, a sensation), the object of awareness "is precisely what it would be, if we were not aware" (99). This however is not Landesman's view; in fact the chapter as a whole constitutes a lengthy argument for what Hobbes termed "the great deception of sense," namely that "Whatsoever accidents or qualities our senses make us think there be in the world, they are not there, but are seemings and apparitions only" (115). Landesman accepts that "material things consist of nothing but particles in motion (as this would be understood in the light of modern physics)" (117). Poets who may be unhappy with this view of the world should be told "that they can still write about the colors of the flowers and the songs of the birds but that they should now understand that they are affected as we all are by the great deception of sense" (125).

Landesman, in fact, endorses "color skepticism," the view "not merely that there are no colored material things, but that nothing whatsoever is colored at all" (134). This does not, however, amount to color nihilism, according to which there are no colors. Landesman is a color Platonist, who holds that there are colors even if nothing exemplifies them. When we imagine a red tomato, "You are seeing in your mind's eye something to which you are inclined to apply the predicate 'red', but you also realize that there is nothing there except the state of consciousness that we describe as imagining a red tomato" (135). He proposes that color enters into such experiences by way of "'predication in the mode of illustration': a quale that is embedded in sensory consciousness shall be said to be illustrated by a state of consciousness" (135). He contrasts this view, which he attributes to Santayana and the "critical realists" of the 1920s, with the adverbial account of sensory consciousness, which he gives reasons to reject. He concludes that "The view of perception in this chapter is consistent with the argument of Leibniz's mill" (140).

The fifth and final chapter, "Agency," addresses a cluster of questions surrounding human action, including the relation between an action and its goal, the difference between agent and spectator, the nature and role of reasons (he rejects Davidson's view that reasons are causes of action), and the nature of deliberation. He argues for libertarian free will and for agent causation and contends that science does not refute these doctrines.

One significant omission from these discussions is the topic of the source or origin of the immaterial mind. Descartes, of course, had a ready answer: souls are created, one by one, by God. Landesman may not want to avail himself of this answer (though he does not think that "the theological question is closed" (3)), but surely some answer is required. And in view of the fact that biological evolution has often been invoked as an objection to dualism, some account is needed of the relation between the mind/soul and evolutionary biology.

A question that naturally arises, but for which I find no answer in the text, is: for whom is this book intended? For a variety of reasons, it does not seem that it is primarily direc­ted towards professional philosophers. There is no claim here to present novel material; rather, already-familiar positions and arguments are deployed in a plausible and coherent arrangement. (Even Landesman's color skepticism, which may strike many readers as novel, is attributed to the critical realists.) And his arguments, while carefully and lucidly presented, usually are not developed in enough technical detail to be convincing to philosophers who are not already in agree­ment. On the other hand, the material does not seem to be aimed at beginners in philoso­phy: such persons are likely to be left quickly behind by the subtlety and sophistication of some of the views considered. Perhaps, then, it would be reasonable to suppose an intended audience of junior or senior undergraduate philosophy students. That is not to say, of course, that others cannot profit from the material.

Another question is, in what sense does this book constitute a "challenge to materialism"? That phrase would naturally suggest a work consisting of anti-materialist arguments, combined with arguments that establish the superiority of dualism and answers to the arguments in favor of materialism. There is such material in the book (Leibniz's mill being a prime example). But it is by no means pervasive; there are extended stretches in which little of the sort occurs. The longest chapter, as was noted, deals with perceptual consciousness; the main conclusions of that chapter may be consistent with dualism but certainly do not require dualism for their acceptance. So what is the point of labeling the book as a challenge to materialism?

This question does receive an implied answer in the concluding section of the book, where Landesman reflects on the many reasons for the persistence of disagreement in philosophy. In view of these reasons, he suggests that the arguments of philosophers

should be looked upon as essentially apologetic or defensive in nature. They have the effect not of providing final proofs of a doctrinal conclusion but of preserving the cogency of the doctrine at issue by warding off the blows of those who reject it and thus maintaining its plausibility, preserving its base, and perhaps gaining some converts. (162)

While philosophers at times have supposed that certain questions had been settled once for all, it turns out that the supposedly doomed alternative views reappear in new versions and with new rationales. "The life of philosophy consists not of frequent funerals for dead theories, but of happy celebrations of recoveries from illness" (162). In the light of this, we can understand how Landesman's book constitutes a challenge to materialism. It does this, not by offering conclusive refutations or conclusive proofs, but by presenting a coherent, well-developed view that represents a viable alternative to the prevailing materialism. So regarded, his effort must be judged a success.