Leo Strauss and the Crisis of Rationalism: Another Reason, Another Enlightenment

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Corine Pelluchon, Leo Strauss and the Crisis of Rationalism: Another Reason, Another Enlightenment, Robert Howse (tr.), SUNY Press, 2014, 309pp, $90.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781438449678.

Reviewed by Samuel Goldman, George Washington University


The last twenty years have seen an extraordinary growth of scholarship on Leo Strauss. Once discussed mostly in polemical terms, Strauss' thought is now regularly the object of careful analysis and informed, if often sharp, critique. The newly receptive attitude toward Strauss has been encouraged by the continuing discovery, publication, and translation of documents from previously overlooked periods of Strauss' career. In addition to lectures and forgotten articles written both in German and in English, we now have access to transcripts and audio recordings of classes Strauss taught at the University of Chicago.

Although many issues remain controversial, the new scholarship on Strauss is characterized by agreement on two main points. First, Strauss' thought must be placed in historical context. Rather than springing fully formed from the head of Zeus, Strauss arrived in the United States in 1937 as an experienced intellectual whose outlook had been formed by Weimar-era debates about the legacy of Kant, dialectical theology, and Zionism, among other issues. Second, religion continued among Strauss' preoccupations after he left Germany. Even when discussing apparently secular matters such as his critique of social science, the "theologico-political problem" remained the center of his thought.

Corine Pelluchon's book enlarges this literature. Originally published in French in 2005, it was Pelluchon's prize-winning dissertation. It is an ambitious attempt not only to demonstrate the "originality" of Strauss' thought, but also to show that Strauss offers a promising philosophical response to the "crisis of our times".

Pelluchon is partly successful in the former task. But that is because it is not very demanding. Throughout the book, Pelluchon attacks the view that "the philosophical career of Strauss is confined to a series of commentaries on the great texts of antiquity." (p. 2) Instead, she contends, Strauss used his engagements with classical and medieval texts to answer and transcend the thought of rough contemporaries such as Franz Rosenzweig, Martin Heidegger, and Gershom Scholem.

Pelluchon's attempt to place Strauss within this constellation of German intellectuals is clearly correct. The problem is that the ahistorical view of Strauss' career she rejects has already been thoroughly refuted -- if it ever had any purchase to begin with. Recent work by Kenneth Hart Green, Michael Zank, Eugene Sheppard, Leora Batnitzky, and Thomas Meyer, among others, advances similar claims about Strauss' Bildung and subsequent trajectory.

Pelluchon's straw-man argument about Strauss' originality may be explained by the facts that the research on which this book is based was conducted more than ten years ago and that the book was intended for a French audience likely to be unfamiliar with Strauss. Nevertheless, there is nothing in the intellectual history portions of the book that readers who follow the literature will find surprising.

This lack of novelty would be excusable if it offered an accessible introduction to Strauss' thought, particularly in its religious dimensions. That is not the case. The argument is sweeping, disorganized, and often difficult to follow.

One obstacle to the reader's understanding arises from Pelluchon's structural choices. The order of topics in the book roughly tracks Strauss' intellectual trajectory, beginning with his dissertation on F.H. Jacobi and continuing through his studies of Plato in the 1960s and '70s.

At each stage, however, Pelluchon quotes from texts written at different periods of Strauss' career -- often without identifying the source or establishing the context for the quote. The result is a pastiche of Strauss' statements on particular subjects rather than a reconstruction of his view at any particular point in time or his argument in any specific text. This result is reminiscent of Strauss' procedure in his own dissertation, which he later rejected as a "disgraceful performance".

Another obstacle to the reader's understanding arises from the translation by Robert Howse. In offering an exceedingly literal rendering of the French original, Howse often fails to supply the attributive and coordinating phrases that English needs to distinguish direct from indirect discourse. As a result, I found it hard to determine in many passages whether Pelluchon, Strauss, or another source was "speaking". The following excerpt can serve as an example:

Everyone has acquired the historical sense. Those who think that the end of human history is the establishment of a just society based on perfect equality seek the most effective means for getting rid of what they consider the vestiges of an archaic society . . . The conflict between East and West, between communism and capitalism, which marked history when Strauss was in the United States, and the reign of ideology are already in play from the moment when, beginning with "the French Revolution and Rousseau," [no citation provided] political philosophy as such is dead. (pp. 186-87)

The challenge posed by passages like this also reflects a tendency in Strauss' own work. Critics of Strauss often complain, with some justice, that they cannot tell whether Strauss is paraphrasing his sources or articulating his own ideas. The reason is that Strauss is often more interested in constructing a kind of philosophical dialogue with his sources than he is in careful reconstruction of their views. On the whole, then, Leo Strauss and the Crisis of Rationalism represents a rather Straussian approach to Strauss -- at least in its method and rhetoric, if not all of its conclusions. The most successful recent studies, by contrast, apply a non-Straussian approach to Strauss that aims to clarify his rhetorical and methodological idiosyncrasies.

The more interesting portions of the book are those in which Pelluchon defends her second thesis: that Strauss, unlike Rosenzweig, Scholem, and Heidegger, was essentially a defender of enlightenment. While these figures rejected or demoted philosophical reason, she contends, Strauss aimed to preserve it. According to Pelluchon, however, Strauss' preference was for "another Enlightenment" based on the concept of revealed Law that he derived from medieval Jewish philosophy, particularly Maimonides.

It is an example of the ambiguity that characterizes the book that this thesis can be read in two rather different ways -- and that Pelluchon does not clearly indicate which one she accepts. One view would be that Strauss understood himself in these terms. The other would be that Strauss opens up this prospect for readers, whatever his own intentions may have been.

My view is that the first version of the thesis, which focuses on Strauss' self-understanding, is not tenable -- primarily due to biographical considerations from which Pelluchon mostly abstracts. The second version does not face the same historical obstacles. But it strikes me as a non-solution to a non-problem -- for reasons I explain below.

Pelluchon's argument for the centrality of Maimonides and Law to Strauss' thought rests on her reading of Philosophie und Gesetz, essays on Maimonides that Strauss published in German in 1935, while he was living in Britain. Large portions of the essays were devoted to a critique of Die Philosophie des Judentums by Julius Guttmann, who had been Strauss' supervisor while he worked as a fellow at the Akademie für die Wissenschaft des Judentums from 1925 to 1932.

In Die Philosophie des Judentums, Guttmann contended that Maimonides approached revelation as an epistemological question: how or to what extent do we know revelation to be true? Strauss responded that Guttmann had missed the point. For Maimonides, the significance of revelation rested on its status as legislation. Rather than a source of knowledge, Strauss argued, Maimonides saw revelation as the basis for an authoritative political order. The task for philosophy, then, would be the articulation of Law and questioning within its boundaries, rather than the pursuit of a foundation for certainty.

In an unpublished lecture from the same period, Strauss attributed the inspiration for his reading of Maimonides to Hermann Cohen. Strauss credited Cohen with identifying without fully appreciating a similarity between Maimonides and Plato, both whom presented philosophy as questioning within a political context defined by authoritative beliefs. In Philosophie und Gesetz, therefore, Strauss suggests that the correct reading of Maimonides opens up the possibility of a reinterpretation of Plato as a political philosopher rather than as an epistemologist. In this way, Strauss continued to distance himself from the neo-Kantian approaches that he had criticized in his dissertation on Jacobi and other early works.

Although her discussion would have been improved by more extensive discussion of primary sources rather than reliance on Strauss's interpretations, Pelluchon does a good job triangulating Strauss, Cohen, and Maimonides. But she does not consider evidence that this overlap of interests was something of an aberration.

To begin with, Philosophie und Gesetz was not a long-planned milestone in Strauss' research program. Rather, it was a detour from his major project at the time: the study of Hobbes for which he had received a Rockefeller fellowship to travel first to Paris and then to the U.K. The problem Strauss faced was that his money was running out and, for obvious reasons, he could not return to Germany. Strauss had been informed by Scholem of a position in medieval Jewish philosophy at The Hebrew University in Jerusalem. Strauss wrote Philosophie und Gesetz, then, at least partly as a job application. Although it deals with themes close to Strauss' main interests, the "Jewishness" of the work is somewhat artificial.

This artificiality was recognized by Strauss' contemporaries. In any event, the Hebrew University Job went to Strauss' intellectual target and former supervisor: Guttmann. In a letter to Walter Benjamin, Scholem attributed this outcome to fact that Philosophie und Gesetz was so clearly the work of an atheist with an instrumental conception of revelation.

More importantly, Strauss seems to have shared Scholem's rather dismissive assessment of Philosophie und Gesetz. In a letter from the 1950s, he even dismissed it as a "Thomistic detour". Perhaps as a result, Strauss chose not to have Philosophie und Gesetz translated or republished during his lifetime. He did discuss Maimonides in other important texts, such as a chapter in Persecution and the Art of Writing. But none of them attribute to Law the centrality that Pelluchon claims for it.

Of course, it is possible that Strauss' real originality lies elsewhere than he intended. So Pelluchon could be following Green and Batnitzky's lead in treating Strauss as a promising source for a new approach to the question about the relations between reason and revelation, philosophy and politics.

But Pelluchon faces a challenge that Green and Batnitzky do not. They write from within the framework of Jewish thought, for which the authority of Law is, if not a given, then certainly a claim that has to be treated with seriousness. Pelluchon goes farther than that. She suggests that the understanding of Law she attributes to Strauss can help resolve the crisis of modernity itself.

But is there really such a crisis? Pelluchon accepts without comment Strauss' contention that there is -- and that this crisis lies in a loss of confidence in the purpose of the West. Remember, however, that Strauss wrote in the periods of the Second World War and the Cold War. The outcome of these events suggests that there was no such loss of confidence, or at least not to the extent that Strauss suggests.

In retrospect, what appeared to Weimar intellectuals like Strauss as the collapse of reason or Western civilization looks more like a crisis of the German mind. More specifically, it was a crisis of the Kantian legacy. In the 1920s, Kantian claims to have identified the a priori structure of knowledge, a universal ethics, and a guide to the progress of human history were no longer plausible.

The collapse of these claims is the essential historical background to Rosenzweig's neo-orthodoxy, Scholem's interest in Jewish mysticism, Heidegger's "thinking", and Strauss' distinctive readings of Maimonides and Plato. But it is not evident that they demand such intellectual maneuvers and radical measures from those of us who never accepted those claims in the first place. In short, Pelluchon does not make a convincing case that "another Enlightenment" is really necessary.

Moreover, a return to revealed Law, which Pelluchon suggests, offers few rewards to defenders of liberal democracy. Although they may be sympathetic to religious doctrines and religious communities, liberal democratic theorists must depart from the assumption that society cannot be governed by a comprehensive Law. This makes an unselective return to premodern political philosophy impossible for them.

Most importantly, Pelluchon's suggestion that Law could be the basis of a distinctive form of philosophy cannot simply avoid the fundamental question posed by the heroes of the modern Enlightenment whom Strauss criticizes as the forerunners of nihilism. Are the claims of revelation actually true? Or are they merely an instrument by which the many exercise control over the few? Epistemology cannot be so easily severed from politics.

Leo Strauss and the Crisis of Rationalism thus has shortcomings both as an interpretation of Strauss and as a prescription for its titular condition. To these shortcomings of content are added some formal and structural problems, which could have been remedied by more extensive revision of the French original. Finally, it must be noted that this book includes frequent typos, consistent misspelling of names (e.g., "Winzenmann" for Wizenmann), and occasional errors of fact (Mendelssohn's Philosophische Gespräche was published in 1755, not 1785). Specialists will want to note Pelluchon's contribution on specific issues, particularly her intellectual debt to Cohen. But there is little of interest here for other readers.