Leo Strauss and the Problem of Political Philosophy

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Michael P. Zuckert and Catherine H. Zuckert, Leo Strauss and the Problem of Political Philosophy, University of Chicago Press, 2014, 387pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226135731.

Reviewed by Miguel Vatter, University of New South Wales


This is Michael Zuckert and Catherine Zuckert's second book on Leo Strauss and the legacy of his thought. The first was a polemical work; here they seek to present this thought sine ira et studio. Their moderation makes for a better book and a useful introduction to the "classical" Straussian worldview. On this worldview, the ills of modernity find their cause in "historicism," the belief that the situated character of our knowledge gives us no access to the "whole" truth. The book's first part presents Strauss's critique of historicism. On this Straussian worldview, the proper response to these same ills calls for a return to "political philosophy" as practiced by Socrates and Plato. In Part II, the Zuckerts explain that the value of this "Platonic political philosophy" consists in opening up the "problem" of western civilization, namely, the life-sustaining tensions between the philosophical and the political ways of life, as well as between human reason and divine revelation. By offering a subtle, non-reductive discussion of these tensions and by remaining attentive to a variety of possibilities these tensions may imply, the Zuckerts have made a real contribution to the non-partisan study of Strauss. However, the polemical approach is not entirely absent, coming to the fore in the third and last part, dedicated to a discussion of Strauss's "practical politics," his debts to anti-liberal thinkers like Schmitt (and Heidegger), as well as to his relation to 20th century Jewish political thought. One can say that in Part III, the book moves from the problem of "political philosophy" to that of "political theology."

The Zuckerts approach Strauss's thought as a whole by adhering to the presentation he favoured during the 1950s. In particular, they highlight the importance of the essays and lectures in What is Political Philosophy? The "problem of political philosophy," as they discuss it, is the one that Strauss referred to when he wrote: "there is a necessary conflict between philosophy and politics if the element of society necessarily is opinion" because philosophy attempts to replace opinion by knowledge (WIPP, 229). From this "original meaning of philosophy," and "provided that it is assumed that opinion is the element of society," then "esotericism necessarily follows" because society will feel threatened by the attempt made by philosophy and will proceed to persecute it (WIPP, 227). Lastly, for Strauss "historicism is incompatible with philosophy in the original meaning of the word, and historicism cannot be ignored today" (WIPP, 227). These brief citations set out in reverse order the tasks taken up by the Zuckerts in the first two parts of the book.

The Zuckerts are aware of the main challenge faced by Strauss with regard to historicism. If Strauss needs to return to the standpoint of "natural" or classical philosophizing, then he must find a way out of the horizon of historical consciousness. However, neither Plato nor any other classical philosopher can help Strauss in this preliminary task, since ex hypothesi they do not stand under this horizon to begin with. Hence, it is only in and through a variant of historical consciousness that Strauss can hope to escape its horizon -- and this paradox is what brings Strauss particularly close to the "radical" historicists, whom the Zuckerts here identify with Nietzsche and Heidegger.

But the effort to escape "philosophy of history" through a radicalization of historicism was widespread in Weimar Germany, apparent in Rosenzweig, Barth, Benjamin, and Jaspers, to name but a few critics of historicism. In particular, Jaspers showed young people like Strauss and Löwith that the problem of the "situation" of philosophy predates Nietzsche, having first being posed by Kierkegaard, who would certainly qualify as a "master of the art of writing" and as a "careful writer" (WIPP 223 and 230), not the least because he acknowledged the debt incurred with Lessing on matters of esotericism. We now know from his correspondence with Löwith that Kierkegaard was an author that Strauss was reading once again in the late 1940s and early 1950s.

Kierkegaard is not discussed in this book, but there are several reasons why he may have been of some importance for Strauss. Kierkegaard is responsible for the first attempt in late modernity to pose "the problem of Socrates" that would exercise Strauss throughout his life. He is also the first to thematize decisionism in terms of the impossibility of philosophy to refute revelation and vice versa. Perhaps most importantly for Strauss, Kierkegaard is the first to use the hermeneutic principle that one should try to understand past great thinkers as they understood themselves, which has become a signature of Straussian hermeneutics, as the Zuckerts repeatedly point out. The paradox of this hermeneutics, of course, is that it offers a principle to interpret the history of political philosophy that rejects the productivity of historical distance and of the very tradition of interpretations for determining the truth of any great thought. Historicism entails the denial that "a final and true account of the whole" is humanly available. Strauss argues that this was not the belief of past great thinkers, and thus that one cannot hope to understand them unless one "takes seriously the intention of the great thinkers, namely, the intention to know the truth about the whole" (WIPP 227). But if one can get out of the historical horizon only historically, and if getting out of the historical horizon is what allows one to see that an absolute truth exists for human beings, then the obvious conclusion is that the condition for the return to "natural" philosophizing is premised on the possibility that the absolute actually occurred in history, as an event that "breaks" history in two. Kierkegaard, not Nietzsche, first associated the problem of Socrates with the problem of revelation as the occurrence of the absolute in a determinate historical situation.

The Zuckerts offer a moderate discussion of the role played by esotericism in Strauss, as an attempt to protect philosophy from persecution in repressive societies. They claim that esoteric writing was particularly important in societies that adopted Judaism and Islam, because in them "the conflict between philosophy and the laws of the city" is most evident, whereas this is not the case in (modern) liberal societies, i.e., "in societies that gave them complete freedom to say or publish what they thought" (55). I have some doubts as to whether this is Strauss's criterion for the right justification of esoteric writing, since it is fairly clear that he thought that "Platonic political philosophy" could also come to feel threatened in a liberal society because, as he says most explicitly, "if I know that the principles of liberal democracy are not intrinsically superior to the principles of communism or fascism, I am incapable of whole-hearted commitment to liberal democracy" (WIPP 222). Thus, a Platonic political philosopher would have no less reason to practice esoteric writing in 20th century United States than in 12th century Cordoba and Egypt.

As William Altman's The German Stranger: Leo Strauss and National Socialism has shown, it is beyond dispute that Strauss not only began to write about esotericism, but himself adopted an esoteric art of writing, once he arrived in the United States. From this fact, however, it does not necessarily follow that he was trying to hide his allegiance to fascist or Nazi principles; the principles of liberal democracy may not be "intrinsically superior" to those of fascism for Strauss, but this may mean that they are both flawed when compared to another standard. In his writings and in his correspondence Strauss was perfectly frank in admitting that for him this other standard was provided by the Platonic Republic. Strauss's entire discussion of esotericism, after all, rests on "the crucial premise" that "opinion is the element of society" (WIPP 222). Now, this premise is not true in at least two ideal cases: in Plato's Republic ruled by philosopher-kings, and in the Hebrew Republic established by Moses in which the idea is that "the whole people of God be prophets."

The great merit of Part II is the authors' insistence that in Strauss we are dealing simultaneously with the return to two equally primordial Republics, the Platonic and the Hebrew, Athens and Jerusalem. The Zuckerts ably defend the claim, with which I happen to agree, that Strauss understood Socrates's great innovation to be the reformulation of "first philosophy" as "political philosophy" (73). Indeed, this reformulation is what they understand as "political philosophy in the decisive sense" (73). In a clear yet sophisticated interpretation of Strauss's reading of Plato, the Zuckerts argue that the Socratic reformulation means that the rule of the philosopher kings in the Republic designates the best regime for the city. However, what is best for the city would not be good for the philosophers themselves since it would distract them from their "pure" philosophical pursuits (120). Philosophers would have to be "forced" to return to the cave and assume a ruling function. The Socratic teaching is a "tyrannical teaching" (On Tyranny 99), and this leads to the following aporia: "There will be no just city until a philosopher becomes king . . . . The reason no political association will ever be just is, therefore, that no philosopher will ever want to rule" (125).

To get around this aporia, Strauss is said to fall back on a second best scenario: Socratic philosophy, based on knowledge of the nature of human things, is not a direct competitor to political rule based on shared opinion, but is merely an "irritant" to the city (126). As such, philosophers become "political" not by ruling directly, but merely by "defending" their zetetic practice before the tribunal of the city (public opinion), mainly by giving a reason for Socrates's martyrdom that would be acceptable to the democratic majority. This reason takes the form of a defence of the rule of law on the part of philosophers, as taught in Statesman and Laws (and Crito). Plato's Socrates "protects" philosophy "by convincing his readers that philosophy was not necessarily inimical to public order and morality" (142), and by exhorting philosophers to "moderate" their speeches rather than give full expression to their pursuit of "wisdom".

The Zuckerts admit that for Strauss the Socratic teaching is a "tyrannical teaching" (137-38) in the sense that for philosophers to rule, they have to make the fortunate encounter with a tyrant who proves to be teachable by them (Laws 704a-712a; Argument and Action of Plato's Laws 56-60) -- an extremely unlikely encounter, as Plato realized in Syracuse and Heidegger and Schmitt proved in 1933. But they do not see the tyrannical teaching as the proximate cause for Strauss's advocacy of combining moderation with wisdom. Rather, they argue that his call to moderation is due to the fact that in their pursuit of knowledge of the whole, the philosophers come across some politically unpalatable truths that should be kept silent, such as the truths that gods do not exist, that the soul is not immortal, that some human beings are superior by nature to others, and so on. But here the reader would be justified in showing healthy scepticism: what's the good of this "moderation" today, when it is the liberal democratic state itself that generously finances the pursuit of natural sciences and bio-technologies that everyday bring more support for the disbelief in God, not to mention in the immortality of the soul, and are making possible a liberal eugenics? Surely it cannot be on account of such atheist "wisdom" -- which is now vox populi -- that Strauss's Platonic political philosophy needs to be "moderated."

Whether Platonic political philosophy is ultimately an im-, trans-, meta-, or arche-political teaching can be endlessly debated. The real problem lies elsewhere, namely, when the Zuckerts take Strauss's claim that in Athens philosophers cannot rule as if it were an absolute, rather than a situated, truth. De facto, this claim is false when considered within the horizon of Jerusalem. For Judaism, Moses was precisely a philosopher who also ruled a people, who succeeded in setting up the ideal Republic, which is at the same time a "rule of law," if one stretches the meaning of "law" to comprise everything entailed by the Torah. The Zuckerts quote Strauss as saying that "The biblical God, however, produces a 'longing for justice and the just city'" (85, citing WIPP, 9) but forget to say that this longing is the same one found in Plato's Republic.

The Zuckerts are to be commended for showing great moderation in their discussion of revelation. They refrain from placing Jerusalem entirely under the rubric of "opinion" and Athens under that of "truth;" they strive to maintain the "fundamental tension" between Biblical revelation and ancient philosophy (90). However, they still fall short of understanding the Torah as an answer to the question "what is political philosophy?" Was Strauss being merely mischievous when he chose to give the homonymous lectures in Jerusalem, or was this gesture an intrinsic part of the message? The Zuckerts' book is superb in giving a first expression of the tension between Athens and Jerusalem, but it stops short of reflexively applying the tension to each of its terms. It has little to say about either how "Jerusalem" can help philosophy or how "Athens" can help revelation. Perhaps, this may be due to the problematic reading the Zuckerts offer of Strauss's use of Alfarabi. They argue that for Strauss, Alfarabi stages the "conflict between philosophy and the 'law'" (117), placing under (divine) "law" both politics and religion, but excluding from it philosophy. Such a reading of Alfarabi (and Averroes, Avicenna, and Maimonides) minimizes the importance of prophetology in their discourses, the recovery of which may be Strauss's most important contribution to the study of medieval political thought.

In Part III, the Zuckerts move from "political philosophy" to "political theology." Heinrich Meier's studies of Strauss have given this latter term, coined by Schmitt, a purely polemical meaning; however it also refers to the scientific study of the mutual influence of theology and jurisprudence in western civilization. It is possible to study political theology, just like Platonic political philosophy, in a non-polemical fashion. Indeed, this study may be essential to understanding the origins as well as the challenges facing constitutionalism. The Zuckerts approach these issues defensively, seeking to extricate Strauss from Schmitt's influence. They argue that Strauss was always critical of Schmitt, that he may have been a decisionist early on but that he never flirted with fascism (despite the well known letter of 1933 where he seems to defend the use of "fascist, authoritarian, imperialist principles" to "protest" against Hitlerism). They also argue that, despite Strauss's above mentioned incapacity to whole-heartedly support liberal democracy on theoretical grounds, he nonetheless could support this regime in practice after 1939 because limited government, mixed constitutions, liberal education and Biblical morality enjoyed "powerful premodern support" (246-253).

This apologetic part of the book actually reminded me more of Charles McIlwain's Constitutionalism: Ancient and Modern than of the author of Philosophy and Law. Except, of course, that McIlwain was conscious that liberal democracy owed all those good things with which it adorns itself to the long and complicated story of the reception and transformation of Roman law in the Christian medieval political and theological tradition. This is the very material from which Schmitt construed his "political theology." In this he has been followed (mostly unconsciously, but not always, as indicated by the case of Ernst Kantorowicz) by the majority of non-Straussian Anglo-American historians of medieval and renaissance political thought. This is the same legal and theological tradition of republican constitutionalism with which Strauss never engaged directly. When he did engage it, in his readings of Marsilius, Machiavelli, Hobbes and Locke, it was only in order to reject it by proxy. The Zuckerts do a wonderful job of showing just how strained and forced Strauss's readings of these thinkers as secret Latin Averroists are, something that I would attribute to Strauss's effort to separate these thinkers from the tradition that nourished them, in order to set them against it.

Despite Strauss's enormous debt to Schmitt when it comes to answering the question "what is law?" (AAPL 60), I would tend to agree with the Zuckerts that Strauss had built up an immunity against Schmitt's answer. But my suspicion is that this immunity came from his anti-Roman pathos present in nearly everything Strauss wrote. For him, the Roman Republic and Roman Law was not comparable to either the Platonic or the Hebrew Republic and their respective Laws. The United States, however, can hardly be understood as other than an attempt to reunite Rome and Jerusalem . . . at the expense of Athens. In the end, this may be the hardest stumbling block to avoid, even for wise and moderate Straussians like the Zuckerts.