Leo Strauss and the Rediscovery of Maimonides

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Kenneth Hart Green, Leo Strauss and the Rediscovery of Maimonides, University of Chicago Press, 2013, 207pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226307015.

Reviewed by Daniel Rynhold, Yeshiva University


When studying individuals from the history of philosophy, scholars can either analyze their subjects in historical context at the expense of contemporary relevance or approach their subject as a philosophical interlocutor, anachronistically plundering the text for its significance to their own concerns. While each approach has its advantages and disadvantages, for decades those working in the field of Jewish philosophy were firmly ensconced in the first camp, focusing on the history of ideas almost to the exclusion of any consideration of their conceptual worth. Moses Maimonides figured more prominently than any other individual in this scholarship, and no one is more responsible for revivifying the academic study of Maimonides in the twentieth century than Leo Strauss, who prima facie approached it in precisely the historical mode that so dominated the field. Yet, in his latest monograph, Kenneth Hart Green, one of the foremost contemporary Strauss scholars, argues that rather than reading Strauss on Maimonides as "an achievement of historical scholarship," we should instead see him as "primarily and perhaps most significantly, a thinker . . . [and] only secondarily a historical scholar, albeit a masterly one" (87). While his two dominant and intimately connected questions, therefore, are "Who was Strauss's Maimonides?" and "Who was Strauss?", in this impressive and tightly-written book, Green similarly engages philosophical questions of import in the course of his own historical study.

According to Green, Strauss's approach to the medievals was "almost unprecedented, certainly peculiar, and surely singular for a modern scholar," (94) in its insistence that the greatest of thinkers, such as Maimonides, "attain a view of things that is never entirely limited, as most of us are, to our time and place" (42). Green's main argument is that Strauss's initial search for the historical Maimonides would result in the unanticipated discovery of a philosopher who could help him find a way through his own modern dilemmas. Methodologically, therefore, in a challenge to the either-or of my opening sentence, Green argues that for Strauss, to understand great thinkers historically is to understand that they believed that they were searching for the truth, for the answers to perennial philosophical questions. Green's Strauss, an unrepentant intentionalist, believes that if we are to understand the medievals correctly we must therefore co-opt the medieval mindset, and without either denying progress in science or romanticizing the past as unconditionally superior to the present, we must take on their quest for truth, leaving behind our modern historicism. For Strauss taking this "historical approach" to medieval scholarship is the very way we engage in the search for truth ourselves -- "only the precise ascertaining of the historical truth allows for the possibility of transcending the historical truth" (86).

What, though, is the transhistorical dilemma with which Strauss was concerned? The problem, at least in its current guise, appears to stem from the collapse of the enlightenment project. Modern thought, Green argues, has approached religion by either refuting it or "claiming to contain it in versions of rational moralism" (4), which amounts "merely to [putting] it to sleep by attempting to theologically repress or deny the deeper conflict in the soul of each human being" (6). It was Nietzsche, who plays an interesting cameo in Green's book, who understood the potential for catastrophe concealed in such approaches. As Nietzsche had before him, Strauss recognized "the frailty of reason as a substitute for religion in political life, never mind what its absence from morality and psychology yields as an access to the human soul" (5). But while Nietzsche's response to the threat of nihilism called on man to fill the vacuum himself, albeit not through the anemic, indeed fictitious faculty of pure reason, ironically the great pessimist was rather more optimistic regarding human nature than Strauss or indeed Maimonides. For, according to Green, Strauss came to understand through his study of Maimonides that Nietzsche's post-religious nihilism could only be avoided through a return to revelation. For Strauss an alliance with revelation "is a better way for reason to deal with its perennial challengers than the forms of modern 'irrationalism' (often themselves devised by philosophers) are able to provide" (158). The real problem Strauss faced, therefore, of which the failure of the Enlightenment project was just a symptom, was the age-old conflict, jointly bequeathed by Jerusalem and Athens, between reason and revelation.

For Green's Strauss, the key to Maimonidean wisdom is the view that the dialectic between Jerusalem and Athens defines Western civilization; the modernist attempt to dissolve that tension ignores the centrality and power of the religious impulse for human endeavor. Nietzsche, and for that matter Spinoza, who as a further subject of Straussian interest unsurprisingly also weaves his way through Green's narrative, believed we could resolve our issues without recourse to religion. In contrast, for Strauss, one cannot suppress the deepest human "desire for eternity" (6) and for God as its source. As Nietzsche's own darker premonitions seemed to predict, the simple rejection of religion risks the possibility that "the 'irrational' returns with even greater force and destructiveness" (158). Thus, for Green, Strauss echoes a number of modern Jewish philosophers -- Joseph Ber Soloveitchik in particular springs to mind -- in thinking that "a balance of forces and a dynamic tension is healthier in the mind than a single dominant view or form of thought in complete control" (18), and it is in his unearthing of the hidden Maimonides that Strauss discovers the way to navigate this necessary tension.

Green's Strauss is not, therefore, a cynical atheist -- and neither is his Maimonides. Rather, Strauss's Maimonides was a revolutionary thinker who "shaped and redirected [Judaism's] fundamental character by allowing greater appreciation for [the] rational profundity [of its truths]" (44). For Green, Strauss's interpretation of Maimonides with its infamous emphasis on micrology -- "the need to pay utmost attention . . . to minute differences or slight variations in terminology, which one might otherwise dismiss as trivial" (58) -- does paint an unconventional picture. His Maimonides is certainly radical, but in Green's eyes, Strauss does not present him as some form of fraud or heretic, as Strauss's Maimonides has sometimes been understood.

The key question, however, is wherein lies the apparent rational profundity of Judaism? According to Green, Strauss's Maimonides clearly wishes to "preserve religious tradition while reforming it in the direction of reason" (123). But, contrary to Julius Guttmann's theologically motivated philosopher of religion, Strauss's Maimonides understood the priority of the political. The Jerusalem-Athens conflict "cannot be . . . resolved on theoretical grounds but can only be harmonized on practical grounds" (106). While Spinoza believes that this entails the annexation of all particularistic religious ritual, Maimonides recognizes that "biblical tradition is consistent with the life of free thought" (124). So when Spinoza judges Maimonides's philosophical account of Judaism to be "a moral sham and an intellectual pretense" (114), according to Green he has failed to understand that they are actually singing from the same hymn sheet, albeit in a different key. Both acknowledge the "theological-political" reality and the need to deal with the "irrational", but Maimonides is the more politically savvy of the two in recognizing that one cannot eliminate the more traditionally "irrational" religious practices without leaving a vacuum which all manner of more damaging "irrationalisms" will fill.

For scholars of both Maimonides and Strauss, however, the issue then becomes the sense in which this really reflects a form of "rational profundity." As Green notes,

the essential conflict in interpreting Strauss himself among students of his thought centers on what one camp contends is Strauss's atheism and another camp maintains is his piety and patriotism as follows from a cognitive theism, i.e., the unwavering belief in the possibility of knowing the truth (159)

otherwise known as the clash between the so-called East Coast and West Coast Straussians. Green appears to fall into the latter "West Coast" camp, believing that Strauss (and his version of Maimonides) is a "cognitive theist." While Green's account will no doubt reawaken the lively debates that surround him, writing as someone who has had limited patience for Strauss in the past, I found Green's portrait compelling. The question, though, is what exactly his "cognitive theism" amounts to and how it relates to religion. Indeed, the main issue that arises out of Green's analysis is that on this question, though certainly not an esoteric writer in the fashion of either Maimonides or Strauss, Green nonetheless remains a little coy.

Green's (and Strauss's) Maimonides did intentionally write so as to "convey radical things moderately, so what we may think remains declared but in safely veiled form, and meanwhile we do not damage or mislead those who will be harmed by hearing a shocking truth" (37). Thus, Maimonides clearly does have deeply unconventional beliefs that would harm the average believer. According to the picture Green paints, Strauss, in divulging this "secret," reveals Maimonides's understanding of the necessity for radicalism in conservative clothing to preserve the tradition which "only remains vital if it allows for those who can think about tradition in an untraditional way, and hence who are capable of freeing themselves from tradition in their minds" (77). If so, then Maimonides's reasons for following the law, as Green notes, "relate to the fact that the truth did not always reside in the beliefs; instead, this truth may reside in the function which those beliefs performed . . . of sustaining Jewish life and its specific teachings" (108). Yet if that is the case, the rational profundity of religion seems not to reside in its theology or indeed in its specific practices. Rather, it resides in its understanding of its own political necessity for the philosophically untutored.

Up to a point, Green is open about this. Maimonides, he tells us, teaches us something important about "human nature, about political order . . . and -- in a certain measure only -- about the relation of man to the divine" (43, emphasis added), with the political here understood broadly as "what would commonly be called the moral or the ethical" (102). So what Maimonides therefore knows is something along the lines of Strauss's claim that politics is "the master science, in the quest for philosophic wisdom of every era, and as the aid of theology in its support for decent human life" (94). But to know this, it seems, is to know that we cannot avoid religion if we are to rein in the irrational impulses of the untutored masses and create space for philosophers to continue their pursuit of higher truths, inasmuch as they are attainable. The sense, however, in which this addresses the human-divine relation at all or renders religion a realm of truth and rationality rather than a straightforward political necessity seems highly questionable. While Green's book was not written to explicate the particulars of Maimonides's theology, the latter's stance towards the truth of religion does seem to rather depend on such specifics. In the absence of any such discussion, it is unclear to me that Green's account maintains a genuine gap between the East and West Coast Straussians. To me, the gap seemed vanishingly small; perhaps, even, the twain have met.

En route to his conclusions regarding Strauss and Maimonides, Green raises a number of questions of philosophical moment. Thus, he asks whether historicism can account for "the possibility of philosophy as a way of life" (46) if such a way of life implies the possibility of a life in search of the truth rather than "the mere playing of a game in the mind" (47). More central is his related questioning of the "unconditional defense of the modern, grounded in irreversible progress" (62), which allows us to dismiss medieval thought rather than considering it seriously as a possible source of practical wisdom. As Green notes, to fully live up to the modern aspiration to free and open-minded inquiry would require us to free our mind from our modern prejudices, particularly, one assumes, the anti-religious prejudice that rules out Maimonides as a thinker potentially worthy of attention. Green does not, however, address the ethical implications of taking a Maimonidean approach to religion that involves a "need for a rethinking of what limits those who think . . . might want to freely impose on themselves as reasonable precautions" (69) and how such an approach would square with our modernist commitments to freedom and transparency.

Most fundamentally though, it is the modern materialist idea of human nature as "one simple thing" that yields a tendency "not to think of the mind as in any permanent conflict or unadjustable tension with other aspects of man or of society" (69) that appears to be the main target of Green's absorbing book, which will be essential reading for scholars of both Strauss and Maimonides. Green leaves us with the impression that the seemingly permanent conflict between those in society who are and are not philosophically inclined is actually the most fundamental one, and it is that conflict to which Strauss believed Maimonides had proffered resolutions worthy of our consideration. For Green, Strauss understood that the fundamentally dialectical nature of humanity can only be served by a parallel dialectic between religion and reason. Thus, while Nietzsche's Zarathustra realized that people were not ready to be informed of the death of God, Green's Strauss confronts us with the critical question of whether they ever will be.