Leo Strauss: Man of Peace

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Robert Howse, Leo Strauss: Man of Peace, Cambridge University Press, 2014, 188pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107427679.

Reviewed by Steven B. Smith, Yale University


The title of Robert Howse's new book is a deliberate provocation. Leo Strauss, a man of peace? This certainly runs counter to the way Strauss is viewed by virtually all of his critics and even many of his defenders. Strauss has been seen as a man of the political right who supported a hard line anti-communism during the Cold War and whose writings have been enlisted into imperialistic foreign policy positions associated with neo-conservatism during the George W. Bush era. How accurate is this depiction?

The current reading of Strauss regards him as a proponent of the tradition of European realism. On this account, Strauss was an early disciple of the German legal theorist Carl Schmitt who made the distinction between friend and enemy the centerpiece of politics. Politics is a matter of war or of unremitting preparation for war against the existential enemy. In fact, it is believed Strauss combed the tradition for evidence of this kind of bellicose nationalism. He highlights, for example, Polemarchus' famous definition of justice in the Republic as "doing good to friends and harm to enemies." Far from being rejected, this role is assigned in Plato's just city to the guardians who must serve as "noble dogs" to protect the city from enemies. This conception of politics is further said to inform Strauss' reading of such classical realist authors as Thucydides, Machiavelli, and Hobbes. Even where he departs from contemporary realists such as his colleague Hans Morgenthau, this is because Strauss was more, not less, of a hawk.

Howse argues that a close reading of Strauss' views on such contested themes as war, violence, and law reveals a very different picture. Not only does Howse rely on Strauss' major writings, but also this is the first book to make extensive use of Strauss's recently released seminar transcripts. Thanks to Nathan Tarcov, the Director of the Strauss Center at the University of Chicago, we can now read online the transcripts that were for years circulated only in samizdat fashion. Howse pays special attention to the classes on Hegel (1958), Thucydides (1962), Grotius (1964), and Kant (1967) to get a more complete picture of Strauss' thinking on such controversial topics as war and peace, justice and empire, law and legitimacy.

On Howse's telling, Strauss literary career began precisely as a defender of Nietzschean "warrior morality" against the democratic liberalism of the Weimar republic. In his 1941 essay on "German Nihilism", given shortly after joining the faculty at the New School for Social Research, Strauss diagnosed this attitude as it emerged in Germany in the years following World War I. Nihilism was not simply a resurgence of German "bellicism," but represented a moral protest against the idea of the open or cosmopolitan society. The idea of an "open morality" divorced from the particularities of nation, race, or class was deemed to exist on a lower level of humanity than a "closed morality" based on such old-fashioned virtues as loyalty, duty, honor, and self-sacrifice. Strauss always defined nihilism as an atheism of the Right.

To be sure, Strauss found this protest movement not in every respect contemptible. It was made up of "quite a few very intelligent and very decent, if very young, Germans" among whom Strauss seems to have included himself. Yet at about the time that Strauss wrote a review essay of Schmitt's Concept of the Political, he was already finding his erstwhile position inadequate. Rather than embracing fascism or some other form of reactionary modernism, Strauss was attempting to discover a "horizon beyond liberalism" suggesting a new position that was beyond the polemics of liberalism and its anti-liberal critics. Howse claims that all of Strauss later works represent a form of t'shuvah -- a Hebrew word meaning repentance or return -- for his early flirtation with rightwing German nihilism.

Exhibit A of Strauss' act of repentance was his novel reading of Thucydides, often considered the godfather of political realism. The search informing Strauss' Thucydides was for a position that was neither the crude reduction of politics to power (the right of the stronger) or to the idealistic and moralistic nostrums of natural law. The core of Thucydides' text was the famous Mytilenian Debate over how to respond to a rebellious colony during times of war. Cleon, whom Thucydides describes as "the most violent man at Athens" and "by far the most popular with the commons," argues for collective punishment, that both the guilty and non-guilty alike deserve death. Diodotus replies that the issue is not guilt but utility, not punishment, but how to make Mytilenians useful to Athens. He argues for leniency on the grounds that people should not be punished for seeking freedom from imperial rule. "Generally speaking," Strauss writes, "even the lowliest of men prefer being subjects to men of their own people rather than to any aliens"—a warning that both the Athenians and the architects of our Iraq policy might well have taken to heart.

The decision to reverse the initial verdict of collective guilt represents Athens at the height of its civilization. Diodotus' speech represents the spirit of moderation, of "enlightened Athenian humanity," a melding of firmness and gentleness. In one of his best sentences, Howse writes: "The speech suggests the possibility that the specifically Jewish conception of t'shuvah has a root in an experience of humanity or the human condition that is, at a minimum, common to the Greek world as well [as] that of revealed religion -- and potentially universal" (138-39). It is the very humanity of Thucydides that breaks through the standard picture of him and Strauss as advocates of sheer power politics. Thucydides seems to represent the perfect coupling of Jerusalem and Athens!

It is only in the seminars on Grotius and Kant, however, that Strauss applied the insights gleaned from Thucydides to the revival of international law and just war theory in the years after World War II. Strauss, we learn, was by no means opposed to a policy of enlightened internationalism. The very fact that he devoted an entire course to Grotius' Rights of War and Peace is itself revealing. Here he found Grotius struggling with the same question that had occupied him since his early Weimar period, namely, how to fashion a political theory that threads the needle between sheer Machiavellianism and Kantian moralism. Accordingly, he finds in Grotius' idea of a law of peoples, the ius gentium, a way to provide a ground for political ethics that is both rational and secular, and yet that recognizes the need for statesmanlike prudence and the ability to adapt to the needs of circumstance.

The problem with Grotius' invocation of international law is precisely that of who is authorized to interpret the ius gentium. If the major actors of the Westphalian world are the sovereign states, each state will be inclined to judge the law in terms of its own interests. It is a well-known jurisprudential principle that no one be allowed to judge one's own case. But where is a neutral judge to be found? In his class on Kant, Strauss finds in Kant's Perpetual Peace a possible solution to a problem left unresolved by Grotius. Kant's idea of a league of nations is one attempt to goad sovereign states to act more in the Diodotean spirit of humanity. Along with Kant, Strauss strongly rejects the idea of a universal state as a "soulless despotism," but this does not rule out the belief in international cooperation and integration through law of the kind evinced in the contemporary European Union. Strauss may have resisted the grand Kantian narrative of human progress toward perpetual peace, but he did not deny that human beings are capable of smaller steps as a way of protecting civilization from the ever-present dangers of rebarbarization.

The question that haunts this book is whether Strauss ever truly succeeded in casting off the demons of German nihilism to which he had been attracted in his twenties or remained a kind of wolf in sheep's clothing. There is the infamous letter to Karl Löwith in which Strauss endorses the principles of the Right, "fascist, authoritarian, imperialist" as preferable to "the cross of liberalism." He praises Roman imperial ideology as an antidote to the "shabby abomination" (meskine Unwesen) that is German National Socialism. Was Strauss, then, a Jewish fascist?

This letter begs to be contextualized. First, it is not clear how much weight can be attributed to a private letter written in May 1933, shortly after Hitler came to power. Many German Jews including Löwith found safety in Italy, and others, like the Jewish Italian classicist Arnaldo Momigliano, embraced the regime. From the position of German Jews, Italian fascism seemed a far preferable solution than National Socialism. Second, it was not at all clear what liberalism was doing for the Jews of Germany. The Weimar Republic was weak and lacked authority. Without the force of a strong state to back them up, appeals to les droits imprescriptibles de l'homme were the political equivalent of a letter to Santa Claus. One of the things that attracted Strauss to Zionism was the failure of the liberal rhetoric of the European states to stop the advance of anti-Semitism.

One of the great challenges in reading Strauss is the question of voice. When is Strauss speaking in his own voice and when is he reconstructing, often in his own distinctive idiom, the words of someone else? He no doubt deliberately and provocatively ran these together. Strauss often restated the views of dangerous writers like Nietzsche and Heidegger with a power and clarity greater than those writers had expressed themselves. He had an uncanny ability to make often dangerous views seem overwhelmingly attractive. One might say of Strauss' views what Oscar Wilde had said, namely, that so long as war is considered evil, it will always have its attractions; it is only when it is considered vulgar that it will cease to be popular.

Yet one struggles to find anywhere in Strauss' writings -- published or unpublished -- anything that sounds remotely like political advocacy. He can be provocative, but he is deliberately coy when alluding to the political issues of the day. In the Preface to Liberalism Ancient and Modern he notes that terms like "liberal" and "conservative" while "sufficient for most present practical purposes" are "not free from theoretical difficulties." The most obvious difficulty is that both liberalism and conservatism have a common basis in liberal democracy and as such are both opposed to communism. Their differences, such as they are, presuppose a fundamental ground of agreement. Strauss wonders whether "at first glance" liberalism does not share in the ultimate goal of communism, which is to bring about a universal classless society, but disagrees only about the means. Communism hopes to bring about the end through violent revolution, while liberalism believes in the peaceful transition achieved through the ballot box. But on closer inspection, Strauss has to admit, the differences are greater than simply questions of means. Liberals believe in the "sacred right" of everyone "however humble, odd, or inarticulate" to criticize the government. It is the belief in the fundamental value of freedom of speech that ultimately distinguishes liberalism from communism.

The core difference between liberalism and conservatism concerns the status of diversity. Liberals are more inclined toward internationalism in politics, while conservatives are suspicious of anything larger than the nation-state. Liberals favor the open society, while conservatives tend to see smaller political units as more conducive to moral perfection. Still, Strauss does not deny that conservatism is compatible with some forms of international organization. He praises De Gaulle ("an outstanding European conservative") for supporting a vision of a Europe des patries. But if the failure of liberalism has been its faith in progress and the consequent erosion of healthily competing political traditions, the failure of conservatism is its embrace of diversity regarding language and culture that is rooted in a distrust of reason. Conservatism favors diversity even at the expense of the unity of truth. Strauss notes that the differences between conservatism and liberalism are especially hard to define in the United States, which lacked an aristocratic tradition of throne and altar and whose political existence came into being through a revolution against the Old World. He takes a special delight in noting the irony that the most conservative group in the United States of his time is called the "Daughters of the American Revolution."

If Strauss were alive today, no doubt his comments would need to be modified. While he remains broadly correct about liberalism favoring polices of one-worldism and international legal tribunals, the defense of cultural pluralism tends to be associated with the multiculturalist Left. The older conservative model of localism and skepticism of foreign entanglements has given rise to a neo-conservative project of exporting democracy to places with none of the prerequisite traditions to sustain it. Present day liberalism and conservatism seem to be in the same position humorously described by Lincoln of two drunks fighting in heavy overcoats and who succeeded only in each fighting himself into the coat of the other.

This book has a distinctive and original take on Strauss and falls outside any of the standard Straussian or anti-Straussian orthodoxies. It may please no one, but Howse is one of those rare authors willing to take Strauss seriously as a thinker, but not afraid to question his legacy. He is critical of Strauss' often deliberately obscurantist manner of writing; he is skeptical of certain "gurus of the right" like Allan Bloom, Harvey Mansfield, and Heinrich Meier, the last of whom he accuses of reading Strauss as a "hyper-Schmittian"; and he deplores a Straussian "cult" that he claims has extended on college campuses to the farthest corners of the nation. Despite his reservations, Howse finds Strauss to be the philosophical and political superior to his contemporaries on the Left, especially Hannah Arendt, whom he sees as pandering to the fashionable world of the New York intelligentsia.

"It has always been with me a test of the sense and candour of any one belonging to the opposite party, whether he allowed Burke to be a great man," Hazlitt once wrote. The same should be said of the legacy of Leo Strauss.