Les recherches philosophiques du jeune Heidegger

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Quesne, Philippe, Les recherches philosophiques du jeune Heidegger, Kluwer, 2004, 300pp (hbk), $127.00, ISBN 1402016719.

Reviewed by Theodore Kisiel, Northern Illinois University


The author proposes to develop Heidegger’s peculiar sense of philosophical knowledge primarily by an examination of the early Freiburg lecture courses given during the “enigmatic” period of 1919-1922, which cluster of courses the author names the young Heidegger’s “Philosophical Investigations” and compares in great detail with the early Husserl’s Logical Investigations. The first course in this breakthrough period, given in the extraordinary Kriegsnotsemester (KNS) 1919, in fact bears the title, “The Idea of Philosophy and the Problem of Worldviews,” and virtually every course thereafter raises the question “What is philosophical research?” and contributes to the development of a “logic” of philosophical concept formation. With the inaugural definition of phenomenological philosophy as the “pre-theoretical primal science of original experience,” it becomes clear that its “logic” likewise departs from the traditional predicative and generic logic of propositions. The starting point for philosophical knowledge cannot be in the judgment, which is predication and position, but rather in the vital and dynamic structure of the disquieting question. Central to philosophy are the questions that minimize the subject-object relation and that accentuate the verbal quality of the question, its questing movement and the temporality of the all-consuming search and re-search, as in Augustine’s “I have become a question to myself” (47), which nevertheless capture in a uniquely “formal” way the very movement of questioning, explicative interpreting, and growing understanding that is already being historically actualized in factic life experience. The basic mode of knowing here is no longer intuition, which has sustained a long tradition of predicative logic from Aristotle to Husserl, but rather explicative interpreting. Its criterion of truth is not verificatory correspondence but rather uncovering disclosure. Its procedural method is not that of assertive positing but of interrogative receptivity attuned to the “give” (donation) of the already pre-gifted situation of factic life experience.

From the course of KNS 1919, the author takes the exemplary question of philosophy to be the somewhat formalized and therefore indeterminate “Gibt es etwas?” (Y-a-t-il quelque chose?” “Is there something?”) which is ultimately translated as “Est-ce que ça donne quelque chose?” (“Does it give something?”) (93) in order to accentuate the uniquely verbal quality of the philosophical question, that devoid of the predicating, positing, and therefore reifying copulative “is,” seeks to articulate the pre-theoretical and pre-predicative dynamics of the human situation. The question itself is grammatically peculiar in combining the interrogative mood with the impersonal form. While noting this peculiar grammatical hybridization, our author does not observe that the young Heidegger, in his analysis of the pre-theoretical environmental experience, is already displacing the impersonal es gibt, which had just notably functioned in his thought experiment of total reification by way of absolutizing the theoretical, with the newly coined impersonal, “Es weltet!” (It’s worlding, i.e., contextualizing) as well as with its allied “Es er-eignet sich!” (It’s happening, taking place, appropriating proper being), which is destined to become Heidegger’s most enduring expression of archaic be-ing. Our author does however identify the impersonal form as a formally indicative expression, as are all the fundamental philosophical concepts of the pre-theoretical primal-science of original experience. “Formal indication permits at the same time of envisaging the matter under discussion in its singularity and of opening it to its essentiation” (119). It is an “eidetic of the unique, of the one time only.” As an eidetic, it has a universal quality, but it is by no means the generic or common universal of the “all,” which pervades the logic of predication. If this “eidetic of the unique” has any universality at all, it would have to be the distributive universal of the “each,” the “in each instance mine” of Da-sein, the “to each its while” (Je-weiligkeit) of the unique time of a one-time-only lifetime. One might also call it a hermeneutic or temporal universal which always requires further interpretation je nach dem, according to the unique context in which each of us find ourselves.

Our author treats “formal indication” and “hermeneutics” in two separate chapters, and never gets around to bringing them together in developments like the distinction in universals made above. The full method of this pre-theoretical science of original experience is therefore that of a formally indicative hermeneutics, which in its language gravitates toward grammatical forms that have hitherto been banished to the margins of a subject-predicate grammar. Our author thus concludes by calling for an “entirely different grammar” for the language and “logic” of this pre-predicative account of original experience, emphasizing especially the interrogative form and some of its impersonal formulations, mentioning in passing the imperative form and the play on verbs in their joined transitive and intransitive forms, and finally comes around to the prepositional phrases turned into nouns that emerge as “modes-of-being” in the early courses and come to dominate Being and Time. Never mentioned are the double-genitives in phrases like the “love OF God” and the “hermeneutics OF facticity” and the middle-voice that lies at the heart of the verbs that express experiential phenomena. Despite these deficiencies and oversights, the author is to be lauded for his close and intense exegesis of a relatively narrow spectrum of the Heideggerian opus, which brings out hitherto unsuspected phenomenological aspects of these little-studied courses and provides much food for thought for future exegetes.