Lessons from a Materialist Thinker: Hobbesian Reflections on Ethics and Politics

Placeholder book cover

Samantha Frost, Lessons from a Materialist Thinker: Hobbesian Reflections on Ethics and Politics, Stanford University Press, 2008, 212pp., $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780804757485.

Reviewed by Stewart Duncan, University of Florida


Samantha Frost's book discusses Hobbes's work by looking at his materialism and its connections to ethics and politics. Though she does argue, as the title suggests, that Hobbes can help us understand ourselves, much of the book is given over to the prior task of understanding Hobbes's views. The book falls roughly into three parts. Chapters 1 and 2 consider materialism about the mind, chapters 3 and 4 focus more on determinism and its ethical implications, and chapter 5 is about power.

Lessons from a Materialist Thinker has, I think, two main projects. The first is one of understanding Hobbes's views, and in particular of undermining certain standard or stereotypical ways in which people think about his work. Thus Frost argues, for instance, "that the Hobbesian subject is not the isolated belligerent of political theory lore" (140). The second project is to learn something from Hobbes about how to understand our place in the world, if we think with Hobbes that we are living material beings. This second project is more explicitly present in the introduction than the rest of the text, but Frost clearly thinks that thinking about what Hobbes had to say is useful, and not because we'll see that Hobbes was wrong about everything.

Chapter 1 addresses some basic questions about materialist approaches to the mind. How can matter think? How can we understand a material thinking subject? One main idea that Frost emphasizes in this chapter is that the thinking body in Hobbes's work is a living body. She has a particular concern with distinguishing the living body from mere mechanical matter. This distinction is supposed to head off the worry that Hobbesian people are just like (or just are) automata or machines. The chapter also contains an interesting argument that "for Hobbes, self-awareness or self-knowledge takes the form of memory" (28).

Chapter 2 asks how reason fits into Hobbes's materialist philosophy of mind. A large part of the discussion concerns how thoughts are connected to one another in the Hobbesian mind. Frost uses metonymy as a model for understanding these connections, and talks about "metonymic shifts from one thought to another" (50). The view described in these terms seems to be, in a different vocabulary, associationism. Indeed, the discussion of these aspects of Hobbes's thought brings out interestingly just how much worked out associationism there is in Hobbes's thought.

There's something of a shift of topic when we come to chapter 3, as it and chapter 4 are concerned largely with determinism and related issues. (Not that Hobbes's materialism and his determinism are necessarily unconnected, but there is a definite shift of focus.)

Chapter 3's discussion starts from Bramhall's objections to Hobbes. Bramhall says that "he who holds an absolute necessity of all things, hath quitted [his] dominion over himself, and (which is worse) hath quitted it to the second extrinsicall causes, in which he makes all his actions to be determined" (77). Frost thinks about Hobbes's views in light of this objection, focusing in particular on the worry that, in Hobbes's deterministic world, the individual will be completely controlled by external causes. The chapter goes on to say a good deal about the complex causes that lead to actions in Hobbes's picture, and indeed the complex internal causes that are involved. Frost looks at length at the "sixfold source" of our desires that Hobbes discusses in De Homine, where he talks about our desires coming "from the constitution of the body, from habit, from the goods of fortune, from the opinion one hath of oneself, and from authorities" (93). However, even in the light of all the details that Frost describes, one might be concerned that Bramhall's worry survives. If nothing else, the internal causes described will themselves have causes, and some of them will be external. Thus it looks like one might still be able to get the worry going about agents just being pushed around by the outside world. Indeed Frost herself seems to acknowledge that there is, as a consequence of Hobbes's view, a sort of "dissipation of responsibility" (103), much as Bramhall feared. This debate seems to me not to reach any real resolution in Frost's discussion (either in chapter 3 or later in the book). On the other hand, the discussion does make the point (both as an interpretation of Hobbes and more broadly) that causes of and responsibility for actions are not always neatly attributable to individual agents.

Chapter 4 begins with a contrast between Hobbes's views of lying and Kant's famously strict views (which are claimed to capture important aspects of the ways in which people more generally think about lying). Much of what follows in this chapter, material laying out Hobbes's views, could be summarized as making the point that Hobbes's ethical views are broadly consequentialist rather than deontological. This is combined with a theme that is prominent in much of the book, an emphasis on the ways in which people's lives are complexly interrelated.

That theme is particularly emphasized in a section of chapter 5 that looks at how we should understand the Hobbesian individual. Large parts of that chapter (which looks overall at how Hobbes thinks about power) are devoted to combating stereotypes of the Hobbesian individual and the Hobbesian sovereign. The "Hobbesian subject", Frost argues, "is not the isolated belligerent of political theory lore. Rather it is an anxious, watchful person ineluctably embedded in a tangle of tense and fragile relationships that serve as the conditions for possible action" (140). The section that makes this case does so convincingly. One might worry a little about the project of arguing against lore and stereotypes -- for one thing, lore and stereotypes seem unlikely to change because of discussions in a specialized book on Hobbes, and for another, there's always a worry that no actual person is being argued against -- but the point is, I think, well taken. Much the same goes for the following section about power and the sovereign, which emphasizes the ways in which the sovereign needs to work to shape the ways people think of and act towards the sovereign, and the "political environment" (160) they generate.

Overall, there are a good many interesting and suggestive things in Lessons from a Materialist Thinker, only some of which I've touched on above. My main concerns arise from there being places where I found myself looking for more detail about just how Hobbes's materialist views worked. Chapter 1 is particularly relevant to my concerns here. Consider the emphasis that Frost places on the thinking body being a living body. It does seem right that Hobbes distinguishes living and non-living bodies. However, it would also be good to know what it is that he thinks distinguishes them. What for Hobbes is it that makes this difference? It's one thing for him to say there is a difference, another for him to be able to explain it. Now, perhaps there is no good answer in Hobbes's texts. But Frost seems not to be terribly concerned with the question. On this same topic, later in the book Frost says that "Hobbes … rejects a conception of matter as inert" (140) which is rather less obvious than that he thinks thinking humans are living bodies. Living bodies might just be very complex ones of a certain sort, but composed of matter that is in a sense inert. Bodies on Hobbes's view, even living ones, aren’t able to generate motion out of nothing.

My wish that Frost would say more about some of the details of how Hobbes's materialism works extends to other topics. For instance, though Frost seems correct to say, when she talks about Hobbes's views about perception, "that Hobbes is acknowledging that although, technically speaking, a percept is nothing but motions, we experience those perceptual motions in such a way that the qualities we perceive appear to us in the objects without us" (26), it would be useful to see what story, if any, Hobbes can tell about how the motion gives rise to the appearance. Here too there may turn out to be little to say, but that itself would be instructive, especially if we're interested in seeing just how much we can learn from Hobbes. It's one thing to learn that an intelligent person can be a materialist, but another to learn that he or she actually has a worked out view we might take seriously.

These worries might seem to be slightly unfair, akin to wishing the author had written a different book or had a different project. Frost quite explicitly has the concerns of a political theorist, and one might think it quite reasonable for her to be more concerned with how materialism affects political theory and ethics than with the details of materialist philosophy of mind. Now, probably the things I'd like to see more fully discussed don't matter too much to the project of showing people that Hobbes does not have such-and-such nasty stereotypical views. And Frost does, in the later chapters, give a good deal of detail about Hobbes's views about how people are related to one another. But it seems to me that extra details in the more metaphysical discussions earlier in the book don't just matter to a scholarly project of working out Hobbes's views in detail. They also matter if we want to use Hobbes as a model for thinking today. Having Hobbes as a totemic past materialist is all very well, but not very useful for actually working out what a plausible materialism might look like. Of course, maybe the relevant details of Hobbes's view either don't exist or turn out not to be very useful for philosophy today -- indeed, I strongly suspect that one of these is the case in the philosophy of mind -- but with this sort of project in mind, it would be good to have a look at more of them. That said, I do wish to emphasize in conclusion that Lessons from a Materialist Thinker is an interesting and rewarding book.