Letters on the Kantian Philosophy

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Karl Leonhard Reinhold, Letters on the Kantian Philosophy, Karl Ameriks (ed.), James Hebbeler (tr.), Cambridge University Press, 2005, 284pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521537231.

Reviewed by Andrew Kelley, Bradley University


The appearance of this English translation of Reinhold's influential Letters on the Kantian Philosophy is important for several reasons. First, this work almost single-handedly brought attention to Kant and Kantian philosophy in the day. In order to understand how the Kantian philosophy was first perceived and propagated in the German-speaking world, one must look at Reinhold's presentation of Kant in these "letters." Second, the Letters quite literally represents the beginning of the movement known as German Idealism because in the late 1780's and early 1790's it shaped the way Kant was understood as well as the issues to which the so-called idealist thinkers responded. Finally, this edition presents translations of the original article-length letters -- or really articles in the form of letters -- on Kant's philosophy that appeared in the journal, Der Teutsche Merkur, between August, 1786 and September, 1787, as well as the additions and revisions that Reinhold made to these letters when they came out in book form in 1790. The 1923 German edition of the Letters on the Kantian Philosophy consists of the 1790 revisions together with additions that Reinhold made in 1792. The problem is that at the time of the appearance of the journal articles in 1786-87, Reinhold was an apologist for Kant's philosophy. Yet, already by 1790, Reinhold saw flaws in the Kantian system and thought it necessary to modify Kant's philosophy in order to make it more coherent with the spirit of Critical Philosophy. These changes crept into the 1790 revision of the Letters. The present translation is important because it represents the only collection in English or German in which the original journal articles from 1786-87 are together in a unified form. The modifications and additions that Reinhold makes in 1790 are also included in this translation.

Karl Ameriks' introduction, in which he situates Reinhold's Letters within the debates of the day and then provides a short analysis of each of the eight "letters" that appeared in the Teutsche Merkur, is substantial and concise. Ameriks writes that Reinhold saw Kant's Critical philosophy as a way to overcome difficulties of the Pantheism Controversy of the mid-1780's, one that concerned the way to understand Spinoza's philosophy and the potential consequences to which it led. Jacobi, an eminent thinker of the day, contended that traditional philosophy led to atheism, that Spinoza's system was the most coherent of all rationalistic philosophies, and that Spinozism was the one that most accurately represented the consequences to which traditional philosophy leads. So, in Kant's Critical philosophy, Reinhold saw a type of thought that was systematic and rigorous, but one that still allowed for belief in God and belief in certain core Christian doctrines, such as the immortality of the soul. Ameriks points out that the Letters really focuses on supposed results to which Kant's Critical philosophy leads, and are not analyses, as such, of doctrines in the first Critique at all. In fact, Reinhold does not comment on or consider such important aspects of the first Critique such as the transcendental ideality of space and time, the Transcendental Deduction of the Categories, or the Analogies, all sections that are at the heart of Kant's epistemology. Seeing difficulty with the early parts of the Critique of Pure Reason, Reinhold sets out, already by the time of the 1790 version of the Letters, to make Kant's epistemology more consistent and systematic by tracing all aspects of knowledge back to the supposedly basic "faculty of representation." In the last part of the editor's introduction, Ameriks summarizes and analyzes each of the letters. He points out (p. xxxiv) that in the last parts of the original version of the Letters on the Kantian Philosophy, one finds an argument that is similar to the famous "Refutation of Idealism" section that Kant added to the 1787 revision of the first Critique. Ameriks also notes (p. xii) that the way in which Reinhold sees the first Critique perhaps foreshadows -- or, at the very least, is indicative of -- the split not only between Kant interpretations but also between philosophies on the continent and philosophy in the English-speaking world. The latter has tended to focus especially on the first sections of the Critique, seeing in them the foundations for science. The Continental tradition, on the other hand, in Ameriks' view, has emphasized -- as does Reinhold -- the implications of Kant's philosophy for metaphysics, religion, and philosophical systems on a grand scale.

In this series of eight articles that Reinhold writes in the form of letters to a fictitious correspondent who is interested in philosophy but who has not yet read Kant's Critique of Pure Reason, Reinhold is not concerned with providing a critical analysis of the Critique. Rather, he sees the virtue of the first Critique as resting with the fact that it can resolve crucial problems in the philosophy of religion. Of particular importance is the "pantheism controversy" that develops as a result of bickering -- beginning with the noted figures of Mendelssohn and Jacobi -- concerning the nature of Spinoza's philosophy. Reinhold sees the issue in historical terms. Enlightenment figures have extolled the importance and scope of reason, culminating in a belief in natural or rational religion. Yet, it is difficult, if not impossible to reconcile this rational, Enlightenment view with the more traditional views of Christianity that emphasize revelation and, perhaps, blind faith. Reinhold claims that Kant's arguments in the first Critique have shown that reason can neither prove nor disprove the existence of God (p. 7 and p. 21). This causes a lack of confidence in reason and may incline people to look to extra-rational grounds for belief in God (as is the case with Jacobi). Reinhold does not want to abandon a connection between religion and reason precisely because he sees that without some basis in reason, then the grounds for religious belief will lack universal validity and, hence, make universal acceptance difficult. So, he contends (p. 16 and p. 24) that even given Kant's attacks on the traditional proofs for God's existence, which might be seen to undermine religious belief, Kant, in fact, had a resolution to the problem of the grounding for religious belief even before the problem surfaced in the guise of the so-called "pantheism controversy." Foreshadowing views of later figures in German Idealism, Reinhold emphasizes the historical nature of the problem: the two opposing sides necessarily had to develop over time in the way that they did so that a resolution -- in the form of Kant's critical philosophy -- could arise.

For Reinhold, the virtue of Kant's "solution" is that it preserves religious beliefs (p. 49) but does so in a way that is acceptable both to the common person and to the philosophically astute person. Furthermore, Kant's view provides universally valid grounds for a belief in God, yet avoids the pitfalls of the traditional proofs for God's existence. For Reinhold, the heart of Kant's philosophy is the moral proof -- or justification -- for belief in God's existence. We must postulate the existence of God, as well as some type of existence of a self that extends beyond the present one, so that we can preserve the idea of the highest good, a situation in which one's happiness is proportional to one's morality. Put in another way, if neither a judge -- God -- nor a means of having morality and happiness coincide -- a future life -- is postulated, then the idea of a highest good is in vain. In this, Reinhold sees Kant as unifying religion and morality based on a need of reason, and, thus, through reason (p. 38). However, to do so, Kant needed to sweep aside the traditional proofs for God's existence -- on which rational faith was supposedly based -- so that a new ground for belief, a moral ground, could be set into place (p. 36 and p. 38). With this emphasis on a moral ground of belief, Reinhold claims that Kant has saved religion insofar as Kant provides us with a rational justification for religious faith but one that neither rests on the traditional proofs for the existence of God, nor on appeals to blind faith. In such a way, Kant has given a basis for religious belief that is both universally valid and that can be universally accepted. For Reinhold, Kant's moral justification for faith can and should appeal to the educated and uneducated alike.

Finally, in the last four letters -- which, as the translator explains, correspond to letters seven through eleven in the expanded 1790 version of the Letters -- Reinhold focuses upon the second "article of faith," which is a future life. This, as well, is a supposition that must be made on the basis of Kantian practical reason: in order for moral life to coincide with happiness, a life beyond the present one must be postulated. These letters are interesting insofar as Reinhold looks at the history of notions of the self in philosophy. As with proofs concerning the existence of God, Reinhold points toward a necessary evolution of the concept of the self. But again, as was the case with the first four letters, Reinhold concerns himself very little with explicating Kant's doctrine of the self and focuses upon the supposed results to which Kant's view of the self leads, especially in relation to the religious issue of life after death. Reinhold's analyses of the nature of the self in previous, especially Greek, schools of thought, and the relationship of these visions of the self to doctrines of immortality of the self, are interesting in their own right, even apart from how they relate to the notion of the self in the Critical philosophy. (This again underlines Reinhold's concern with the historical development of philosophical doctrines).

The lengthier additions that Reinhold makes to the 1790 edition of the Letters are provided in the appendices to this translation. They represent not only expansions of his earlier discussions of the aforementioned topics, but also additions, especially in the areas of moral and legal philosophy. Likewise, as was mentioned earlier, they represent a conscious turn by Reinhold from being an apologist for the Critical philosophy, in letter, to being an apologist for the Critical philosophy, in spirit. In other words, Reinhold, in 1790, begins to make corrections to what he sees as problems in Kant's philosophy.

The translation by James Hebbeler is superb. He remains close to the text itself without making the text feel too German in its sentence structure. At points, long sentences are broken into shorter ones, but this in no way harms the flow of the text or the meaning of the passages. Likewise, the translator sometimes helps the English reader by adding the original word or phrase that in the original text occurred as a pronoun. If the translator would simply have given the corresponding English pronoun, then the English sentence would be much more unclear. In the footnotes, Hebbeler includes definitions of key terms that are problematic to translate into English, references to passages in Kant's own works, and references to other works or passages in other thinkers' texts that are similar to those in the Letters. Likewise, in the footnotes for the main text of the translation, the translator indicates small, yet significant passages where the original version of the Letters differs from the 1790 version.

Simply put, this edition of Reinhold's Letters on the Kantian Philosophy is excellent. A translation of these "letters" has long been needed due to the singular importance of this work for German Idealism. Because copies of the original, Teutsche Merkur version of the Letters are so difficult to obtain -- even in German -- scholars of Kant, Romanticism, and German Idealism will all benefit from this volume. This translation could serve as a convenient starting point for courses on nineteenth century philosophy. Although the ideas are not easy, the prose and style in which Reinhold writes is such that it could be accessible to students in upper-level undergraduate courses. This is significant because it is often times difficult to begin a course about this time period when students do not have a decent knowledge of Kant, thereby requiring that a significant amount of the course be dedicated to a review of Kant’s philosophy. Commencing a course with this book would allow students to begin where the other thinkers of the period actually began. The instructor would still need to supplement this book with a short review of some of Kant's basic doctrines: space and time, the nature of the categories, things-in-themselves, etc. But, this book would give students a better sense of what issues were important for the early German idealists than would a review of Kant's philosophy. This book, however, is not just a student's version of a famous text; it has much to offer graduate students and scholars of the era. First, the original version of the Letters is very difficult to find and this translation makes it accessible to everyone. Second, even though advanced scholars will more than likely have the language skills to read the Letters in the original, this translation makes it such that scholars might only need to turn to the original German in cases in which a thesis or a reading centers on the way in which a word or a phrase has been rendered. The translation is very well done. In short, anyone who is interested in Kant or in nineteenth century philosophy should have this book in his or her collection.