Levels of Argument: A Comparative Study of Plato's Republic and Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics

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Dominic Scott, Levels of Argument: A Comparative Study of Plato's Republic and Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics, Oxford University Press, 2015, 235pp., $70.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199249640.

Reviewed by Samuel H. Baker, University of South Alabama


According to Aristotle, the end of theoretical philosophy is knowing truth, while the end of practical philosophy is "not knowing but acting" (Nicomachean Ethics I 3, 1095a5-6). Consequently, the subject matter of theoretical and practical philosophy may very well overlap. In such cases, the theoretical philosopher will consider the subject with a view to comprehending it as thoroughly as possible, while the practical philosopher will consider it just as is useful for acting well. To illustrate this point, Aristotle uses a case of productive expertise: "the carpenter and the geometer inquire about the right angle differently -- the former insofar as it will help his work, the latter with a view to what or what sort of the thing the right angle is" (NE I 7, 1098a29-32). Because practical and theoretical philosophers approach their overlapping subject matter differently, the theoretical philosopher would sometimes seem to be able to grasp at a higher level of precision and explanatory sophistication the practical philosopher's own arguments. The possibility of reading practical arguments at these two different levels is the subject of Dominic Scott's careful new book.

Scott pursues the theme not only in Aristotle but also in Plato. Perhaps in order to give himself an executable project, he focuses on one work of Plato, the Republic, and one work of Aristotle, the Nicomachean Ethics. Using terms from the former, Scott calls an investigation of practical arguments at the higher, more theoretical level "the longer route" and an investigation at the lower level "the shorter route." His thesis is as follows. Both philosophers acknowledge the possibility of a longer route, but for "Plato such a route, strenuous as it is, constitutes the ideal, while for Aristotle it is surplus to requirements." Yet in the Republic and the NE, both philosophers follow the shorter route -- "Plato because he thinks it will have to suffice, Aristotle because he thinks that there is no need to go beyond it" (5). Some of my remarks below will give reasons to think this requires qualification.

Scott proceeds at a somewhat leisurely pace through various famous passages and interpretive questions that are related -- at varying degrees of relevance -- to his theme. Also, the book's first half, devoted to the Republic, is not strictly necessary for understanding the second half, devoted to the NE. These factors combine to make the book less a thesis-driven monograph and more a loose thematic study. Indeed, Scott himself suggests that one of the primary ways his work will be valuable is due to his own chosen methodology. First, by juxtaposing the Republic and the NE as he does, "we shall discover fresh ways of looking at them, prompting new questions for further debate" (5). Second, to help us understand the methods that Plato and Aristotle follow, Scott generally eschews asking how they might have solved certain problems arising from their texts (which he calls "rational reconstruction") and instead restricts himself to an analysis of the arguments that Plato and Aristotle actually deploy (57n.15, 121n.25). Both methodological decisions do increase the value of Scott's book and help to distinguish it from similar work in the field.

In what follows I summarize the chapters, making critical comments along the way.

Part 1 (chapters 1-5) focuses on the defense of justice in the Republic. Chapter 1 distinguishes a longer and a shorter route that one might take in executing this defense, and it in particular considers the shorter route from books II-IV. Here we get an overview of the methods of this route: the state-soul parallel, the use of hypothesis, the appeal to observation, and the "functional" method of definition. Scott contends that Plato never "assumes the metaphysics of the central books [i.e. the Forms] in the shorter route in books II-IV" (28), explaining away the one passage that Scott thinks could be thought to tell otherwise.

Chapter 2 tackles the main reason why people do think the metaphysics of Forms is presupposed in books II-IV. This is the much-discussed problem raised by David Sachs, which runs as follows. In book II Socrates is challenged to show that the just life is always more preferable than the unjust, where justice is understood in a conventional sense (e.g. keeping promises and not stealing). However, when Socrates answers the challenge in book IV, he seems to understand justice differently, as a kind of health for the soul. Why then does the Platonically just person do conventionally just acts? Scott canvasses the main responses, which make use either of Plato's Forms (The Metaphysical Response) or of the distinction between necessary and unnecessary desires from books VIII-IX (The Psychological Solution). He then offers a version of the psychological solution, arguing that it can already be found in books II-IV. In short, the Platonically just person will receive an education similar to that of guardians in the ideal city, and thus will be "such as to restrain his appetites, which will make him unlikely to engage in pleonexia [taking more than one's fair share]" (37). While I agree that we should be able to find a solution within books II-IV, I don't think what Scott has found is alone satisfactory. "Unlikely to engage in pleonexia" is just too weak. First, if goods are scarce enough, even the Platonically just person might steal or kill in order to satisfy his necessary physical desires. Second, the desire for truth, which seems to have no limit (except perhaps gazing on the Form of the Good perpetually), is classed as necessary. Thus, a Platonically just person might steal or kill in order to have more leisure to slake his powerful desire for the truth. In neither case does the Platonically just person look conventionally just.

Chapter 3 treats the longer route as found in books VI-VII. Here Scott discusses the high and lower levels mentioned at VI 504a-506b, summarizes the guardian education, and compares the two routes: in contrast to the shorter, the longer involves a more determinate grasp of issues, does not rely on hypotheses, apprehends its object with the intellect alone, and requires a more extensive study of topics as well as the ability to fend off all objections. In preparation for the next chapter, Scott says that while it would be absurd to suppose that Socrates follows the longer route in the Republic, it is not absurd to suggest that he follows a "middle way" -- based on the shorter but borrowing metaphysical claims from the longer.

Chapter 4 asks whether Socrates uses the metaphysics of the central books to support the defense of justice in books VIII-IX. Scott analyzes the degenerate souls argument (543c-580c), the first (580d-583b) and second (583b-588a) hedonic arguments, as well as the 'many-headed beast' argument (588b-592b). According to him, the first two arguments follow the shorter route, while the second hedonic argument follows the "middle way." And though the 'many-headed beast' argument might be heard as following the middle way, it could also be heard as following the shorter route and thus can "stand on its own two feet" (83). By this last metaphor Scott seems to mean that arguments following the shorter route do not "rely on" (83) the metaphysics of the central books, where this in turn amounts to the claim that someone who is not committed to that metaphysics could rationally accept them. But could someone who completely rejected that metaphysics rationally accept them? As far as the 'many-headed beast' argument is concerned, which assumes an absolute standard of goodness by which one part of the soul is ranked better than another, I think not. If this is so, then there is some sense in which that argument does not stand on its own two feet.

Chapter 5 explores the idea that the longer and shorter routes are in a way "circuits" -- involving an ascent and descent. It is clear how this works in the case of the longer route: the guardians, having received true opinions from their upbringing, ascend to the knowledge of the Form of the Good, but then descend by applying their wisdom in particular ethico-political judgments. But where is the shorter route? Scott uses the question as an opportunity to give a judicious interpretation of the allegory of the cave. He argues in particular that the shorter route corresponds to the turning away from shadows and to the seeing of the fire and artifacts -- the latter representing 'lower-level universals' (93). However, the second hedonic argument is a "brief, temporary, and somewhat disorienting glimpse outside the cave" (96). In response to the problematic fact that Socrates prohibits engaging in dialectic about moral matters before completing a mathematical education at age 30, Scott's not implausible solution is that this prohibition occurs only in the ideal and not the non-ideal state (100). And yet I wonder: can this be the full picture? Many in the ideal state do not receive a guardian education, and won't they need something like the shorter route?

Part 2 (chapters 6-10) treats roughly similar issues in the Nicomachean Ethics. Chapter 6 divides into two parts. The first argues (building on work by John Cooper and Richard Bodeüs) that the NE is a work of 'political science,' in particular legislative science, and this is offered as an unappreciated similarity between the NE and the Republic. The second half notes the possibility of an Aristotelian 'longer route,' which would put no limit to the desired degree of exactitude or explanatory sophistication. For though Aristotle in the NE rejects the Platonic Form of the Good, he does seem to borrow findings from his works of biology, psychology, metaphysics, etc. The shorter route doesn't require a thorough knowledge of these findings but only what is helpful for the "practical goals of political science" (121). Most of this work is prefatory, but I note that here and elsewhere Scott appears to suppose that if Aristotle rejects the existence of the Form of the Good he rejects the existence of any separate good. But there are reasons to doubt this. For example, unless Aristotle thought a separate good served as a standard across substances, how could it make sense for him to claim that the human is better than all other animals and that the stars are better than humans (NE VI 7)?[1]

Chapter 7 examines how the NE understands practical philosophy to lack precision. Here Scott (following Deborah Achtenberg and others) distinguishes between practical precision, which is "highly detailed guidance about particular actions" (126), and theoretical precision, which is the sort of precision proper to theoretical philosophy. While the latter is possible to achieve, the former is not. This leads Scott to examine several passages in the NE (I 6, 7, 13 and X 4, 8) where Aristotle put limits to the pursuit of theoretical precision. Though generally methodical and level-headed, Scott's discussions here tend to over-read Aristotle's stated reasons for the limitations. For example, in NE I 6 after arguing that the term "good" is not used univocally and then offering some possibilities about how the term might be used, Aristotle says (in Scott's translation), "But presumably [isōs] we should set aside these questions in the present context. To seek precision about them would be more appropriate to another branch of philosophy" (1096b30-31).

With these lines, Scott says, Aristotle "ruled out" (128) any further investigation on the topic as being "not part of political science" (129). However, just because an investigation is "more appropriate to another branch of philosophy" does not make it inappropriate to political science. It could be appropriate to both.

Moreover, Scott here and elsewhere assumes there is a sharp dividing line between what is and is not part of political science, but I very much doubt this is so. First, Scott assumes that the only reason Aristotle sets limits to theoretical precision is because such precision would be "superfluous" to better achieving the practical end of political science. However, in some cases it might just be that a practical end puts one under time constraints. These in turn might require one to forgo a more precise investigation, which could have otherwise been at least somewhat helpful. Second, one can often read Aristotle's language as expressing a lack of certainty about where exactly he should be drawing the line. In the passage above, note that the optative verb, which Scott translates as "would," could also be translated "might," and that the adverb "isōs," which Scott translates as "presumably," could also be translated "perhaps." These two small changes give the line a different feel: "But perhaps we should set aside these questions in the present context. To seek precision about them might be more appropriate to another branch of philosophy" (1096b30-31).

I myself suspect that Aristotle is often genuinely unsure about where exactly to draw the line, and that is because there is not always an exactly right place to draw it. Very probably the transition from political science to not political science is often vague (in the philosophical sense). Thus, Aristotle is often forced to draw a more or less arbitrary line.

Chapters 8 and 9 argue that Aristotle, like Plato, conceives political science as involving a 'methodological circuit.' Roughly, chapter 8 tackles the upward journey and chapter 9 the downward. According to Scott, "the theoretical principle to which the student of political science is moving is the account of eudaimonia being sought in the NE" (147). It is possible to give an explanation of this principle, but this would be "inappropriate to the practical nature of political science" (155). (Some of the critiques I just made above are, I think, relevant here too.) Chapter 9 argues that the downward journey consists in applying the account of the best good by "establishing claims about political constitutions and laws" (177). Interestingly, Scott thinks that Aristotle never takes this downward journey in his extant writings. One might have thought that this happens in the Politics, but Scott argues that it employs a significantly different methodology from that of the NE and so could not be the completion of the "philosophy of human affairs" begun there.

Chapter 10 tackles the famous 'endoxic method,' and argues (improving on work by David Bostock and Marco Zingano) that Aristotle employs it not nearly as often or systematically as many scholars assume. Scott plausibly argues that in fact "there is no one method of ethics to be found in the NE" (209), the endoxic being one among others. The brief "Conclusion" recapitulates Scott's main theses and closes with some provocative questions. For example, after arguing that because of Aristotle's teleology he is more optimistic than Plato about the "reliability of (considered) human judgement" (214), Scott asks: why is it then that Aristotle is so contemptuous of the "cognitive state of 'the many'" (216)?

This book is without question a valuable contribution to our study of the Republic and Nicomachean Ethics. The carefulness and reasonableness with which Scott approaches the text inspire much confidence. The book of course has weaknesses. Scott's interpretations never seem definitive or strikingly original. He sometimes writes in apparent ignorance of relevant literature: e.g. Lawrence on the ergon argument,[2] Frede on the nature of endoxa,[3] Lear on the teleological nature of the human good[4] and Rosen on the non-identity of final and formal causes.[5] With one possible exception, he never evaluates Plato and Aristotle's views from his own philosophical perspective, and he certainly could have done more to communicate the value of his work and to sustain his reader's interest. Nevertheless and more importantly, this methodologically innovative study on a well-chosen topic really does manage to let fresh air into our perennial reading of the Republic and Nicomachean Ethics. I believe it will indeed "prompt new questions for further debate" (5).

In closing, let me pose some inter-related questions that Scott's work prompted for me. As I understand it, a direct implication of Scott's Part 2 is that most students of practical philosophy will need to defer to the judgments of experts in many different fields -- metaphysics, psychology, epistemology, etc. But would Aristotle think that the students would themselves need to figure out which alleged experts to defer to? Or is it more likely he would think that they would defer to an expert practical philosopher who has done that work for them and has thus not followed the "shortest route" possible? As a matter of fact, isn't this the way that many people have used the NE? Is it not part of the book's enduring power that it is deeply informed by -- even if it does not always strictly presuppose -- Aristotle's own highly consistent and defensible Weltanschauung?[6]

[1] On this point, see Gavin Lawrence, "Snakes in Paradise: Problems in the Ideal Life," The Southern Journal of Philosophy 43 (2005), 126-165.

[2] For example, G. Lawrence, "Human Good and Human Function" in Richard Kraut (ed.) The Blackwell Guide to the Nicomachean Ethics (Malden, MA: 2006) and Gavin Lawrence, "Is Aristotle's Function Argument Fallacious? Part 1: Clarification of Objections." Philosophical Inquiry 31 (2009): 191-224.

[3] Dorothea Frede, "The Endoxon Mystique: What Endoxa Are And What They Are Not," Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 43 (Winter 2012): 185-215.

[4] Gabriel Lear, Happy Lives and the Highest Good: An Essay on Aristotle's Nicomachean Ethics (Princeton, 2004), esp. Chapter 2 "The Finality Criterion," 8-46.

[5] Jacob Rosen, "Essence and End in Aristotle," Oxford Studies in Ancient Philosophy, 46 (Summer 2014): 73-107.

[6] Thanks to Joseph Karbowski for comments on a draft of this review.