Levels of Organic Life and the Human: An Introduction to Philosophical Anthropology

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Helmuth Plessner, Levels of Organic Life and the Human: An Introduction to Philosophical Anthropology, Millay Hyatt (tr.), Fordham University Press, 2019, 375pp., $35.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780823283989.

Reviewed by Lenny Moss, University of Exeter


J├╝rgen Habermas, amongst many others, has heralded Helmuth Plessner's 1929 magnum opus as the most important work in 20th century German philosophy to have not hitherto been translated into English.[1] One may well wonder, however, whether a nearly century-old work in which biological understanding plays a central role, may still have something to teach us. I will suggest that this is indeed the case and begin by offering two points of orientation that I hope will provide some sense of how this is even possible as well tempt the reader's interest in grappling with the details.

It would be difficult to overstate the influence of that which I think would be apt to call 'English Naturalism' has had on the deep-seated background assumptions and perceptions of English language speakers and beyond. These assumptions intermingle epistemological, ontological, ethical and aesthetic dispositions, even if in very subtle ways. English landscape painting, for example, reveals the hallmark of its venerated 'naturalism' in precisely a pristine absence of any traces of human subjectivity on the canvas. Epistemologically, English Naturalism eschews even the very idea that its taxonomically oriented approach to species differentia would not be equal to the task of addressing questions of "human nature". It is thus little wonder that when English Naturalism sets its sights on human nature, it discovers that it has precious little to say.[2] Plessner, by contrast, will have a great deal to say, albeit not by offering a separate epistemology of the human, but, quite to the contrary, by painting a very different picture of nature to begin with, a picture that has the resources to sketch both an overall continuity and the realization of radical transitions, the seeds of which are already immanent in the most basic structure of the living body. Plessner offers a radically different point of departure than that of English Naturalism for understanding life, including human life. Regardless of what one may eventually conclude about his formulations, it would be hard to ignore the fact that not only does his project anticipate central concepts of autopoiesis, niche construction, developmental systems, process biology, facilitated variation, phenotypic developmental adaptation, motor intentionality, embodied, embedded and enactive cognition, and "we-mode" but also, perhaps even more significantly, does so as part of a unified systematic theory rich with myriad implications that have even yet to still be fully explored.

Plessner's book has often been seen as a radicalization of Dilthey's historical hermeneutics now turned toward a hermeneutics not of symbolic expression but of embodied expression across the spectrum of life-forms, complemented by the addition of phenomenological method. I will suggest that a better synoptic characterization would be that of a critical and synthetic conversation with Kant, Hegel and Dilthey, brought under the rubric of a philosophy of life (lebensphilosophie). While a phenomenological orientation appears to be at play in his later, and better known, work on laughing and crying,[3] Plessner speaks directly to the inadequacy of phenomenology with respect to his present intentions.

It is the nature of phenomenological study to begin with the indicative essential characteristics, and it remains uncertain whether it is capable of penetrating further to those that are constitutive. They certainly belong to its area of research. Phenomenology is necessarily barred, however, from insight into their categorical character. If we are then to ask the question of how these constitutive essential characteristics can emerge on their own, in an unforced way, from the problems of a logic of biology or even from the attempt to systematize biology itself, it is not the method of static description we must apply, but we must rather attempt to guide the way through the essential layers following a principle or a deduction of the categories of life. (p. 108)

Pace Dilthey, Plessner's "Levels" is not about interpreting historical contingencies, nor about the more familiar evolutionary sedimentation of frozen accidents, but rather is about looking to establish transcendental conditions (or categories) of biotic possibility that he refers to as "modals of the organic." As with Hegel he challenges us with a proposed logic of life always mobilized by dialectical tensions, albeit not on the basis of any form of idealism and bereft of a Hollywood ending.

For Plessner, that which is both the sine qua non of the living state and that generative 'principle' from which organic modals can be derived is the on-going performance of a self-positioning boundary, and it is highly unlikely that anybody has ever thought as deeply about the implications of what this means. For Plessner, the living boundary is both a liminal zone that mediates between organism and the outer medium, itself being neither, and yet also an enactively self-defining and enforcing circumference and outer-limit. The organism moves outward in the expansion and assimilation of its liminal zone and moves inward, taking the outer within, re-establishing itself and reasserting its perimeter. The living boundary already introduces a subject-object status that prefigures for Plessner the overcoming of dualisms between inner and outer, interiority and exteriority. The living boundary is an on-going enactment of an exteriority that it defines and yet also reaches into and assimilates and of an interiority that is both sustained and transformed. The motive force of the dynamic living state is this double aspectivity of its existence and the dialectical tension which drives it forward.

It is these two moments together that determine the essence of the boundary as that which leads to the other and at the same time closes it out. It is thus that the boundary induces boundedness without thereby eliminating the connection between that which is bounded and the other. The isolation achieved with the boundedness in fact signifies the integration of the bounded entity into the context. (p. 124)

Plessner finds in the dynamics of double aspectivity the constitution of a kind of self. Living entities develop which means they both lead away into something new and yet persist as what they are. It is in their constant becoming Other that they become themselves and constitute and sustain a "form-idea." Plessner's early concept of development, is capacious enough (unlike some more recent formulations that presume multi-cellularity) to characterize even single celled life-forms.

There is a clear sense in which Plessner's anthropology is already anticipated in his earliest formulations of double aspectivity and becomes more conspicuous as he ascends up the 'levels'. Even at the level of a simple organism, the dialectics of double aspectivity suggests the emergence of a non-empirical, enactively posited center or core, the predecessor, for Plessner of the possibility of consciousness.

The complex organism is dependent upon its constituent organs. It is both the sum total of its organs and yet it also has its organs (which we know can be detached and replaced). The posited 'core' of the organism thus both 'has' its organs and lives through them. Further anticipating his anthropology, Plessner already speaks of the complex body as "mediated immediacy."

The living body's positedness in the body that it is or its doubling in the body is (in contrast to the immediate existence of the nonliving body) a passing through the body that it is. The living body mediates its own existence. And yet this mediatedness is supposed to make up the basic character of actual being -- that is, be expressed in it. The body must thus confront this being and at the same time be this confrontation itself. (p. 159)

As we will see, the dialectics of positionality, issuing into different levels of positionality by way of folding back upon itself, describes the logic that connects the human to all other levels of organic life.

As the positionality of the organism entails its presence in a liminal transition state with its surrounding medium, the organism can be said to always be beyond itself. Plessner connects the dialectics of adaptedness and adaptation with those of assimilation and dissimilation.

As carrier of the boundary that both runs in between and bridges the in-between, the living body separates the alien zone from its own zone in order to join the two zones together. That is, the body's own zone, irrespective of its positioning over against the alien zone, disintegrates in itself in order to bring about a connection with the alien zone. (p. 182)

Plessner accordingly refers to the 'duality of autonomous self-modification' as being an essential trait characterizing life (p. 183). Immanent in his account is a proactive, enactive understanding of adaptive self-transformation in balance with self-continuity. An organism's ability to realize this balance dissipates over time, which is the meaning of aging.

Plessner's distinction between plant and animal is both an enabling pathway towards his anthropology but also quite distinctive and worthy of consideration in itself. Contrary to the mainstream legacies of botany and zoology, but consistent with the logic he is developing, plants and animals for Plessner are a priori life-categories or modals of the organic based upon filling alternative organizational possibility spaces that follow from the dialectics of positionality and not in the first instance about the distinction between autotrophy and heterotrophy. Accordingly, certain heterotrophic species such as corals, hydroids, bryozoan and ascidians are classed by Plessner into the plant category. In broad terms, the plant-animal distinction is defined by the difference between "open" and "closed" positionalities, a distinction which has much to do with levels of mediation. One may think of this as two alternative basic strategies for achieving the aforementioned balance between assimilative and resistive moments immanent in any form of positionality.

"A form is open if the organism in all of its expressions of life is immediately incorporated into its surroundings and constitutes a non-self-sufficient segment of the life cycle corresponding to it" (p. 203). An open form of positionality, we can say, doesn't require mediation by way of a posited center and the consequence of this is realized throughout the morphology, physiology and growth patterns of the plant.

Morphologically this is manifested in the tendency of the organism to develop externally and expansively in a way that is directly turned toward its surroundings. It is characteristic of this kind of development that it does not have the need to form centers of any kind. The tissues responsible for mechanical solidarity, nutrition, and stimulus conduction are not anatomically or functionally concentrated in particular organs but rather permeate the organism from its outermost to it innermost layers. The absence of any central organs tying together or representing the whole body means that individuality of the individual plant does not itself appear as constitutive but rather as an external moment of its form associated with the singularity of the physical entity; in many cases the parts remain highly self-sufficient in relation to each other (graftings, cuttings). This led a great botanist to go so far as to call plants 'divididuals'. (pp. 203-204)

While movement is generally limited in plants, the hallmark of open positionality for Plessner is not the lack of movement as such but the fact that the plant doesn't have a center from which movement is initiated but rather movement is always and only in response to conditions of the medium. Plessner's holistic and systematic characterization of the plant includes the observations that embryonic or juvenile structures do not tend to be lost or morphed into mature forms as is the case with animals, growth tends to occur only externally (from the meristems), functional differentiation in the absence of central integration is limited and the life span of the plant is more indeterminate and open ended than that of the animal. All of these features are plausibly presented as part and parcel of the open form of positionality. Plessner reminds us that what he is presenting are a priori organic modals. "The dividing line between the plant and the animal kingdom cannot be found empirically; transitional forms exist alongside distinct ones" (p. 217).

The closed and centric positionality of the animal is characterized first and foremost by the immanent constitution of a self. While not occupying any definitive space, it is spatial inasmuch as it constitutes the non-relativizable "here" of the organism. Double aspectivity is defined for the animal with respect to a separation, and at the same time non-separation, between its core, its here, its self and its whole body of which the core is part.

Thus the living thing whose organization exhibits a closed form is not only a self that 'has', but a special kind of self, a reflexive self or an itself. We may speak of a living thing of this kind as being present to the living thing that it is, as, by virtue of its set-apartness from this living thing, forming (not yet 'having', which is why it is not yet an 'I'!) an unshakeable point in this living thing in relation to which it reflexively lives as one thing. In the irreducible oscillation between being inside and being outside that distinguishes the positionality of the closed organism on the ground of simply being the body itself lies the boundary for the referentiality of the thing back to itself. (pp. 220-21)

One can anticipate the movement of Plessner's dialectical logic in setting up the conditions for his anthropology. The animal has a self-presence but not a reflective access to it. The animal has achieved a distance to its own body (one might say a "detachment") but does not have a perspective on having such distance. It enjoys a qualitatively new level of agency in its relationship to its surround but it is still fully absorbed in its here and now. The animal is conscious inasmuch as it has awareness of that which it stands in opposition to and reacts to from out of its center (albeit without being able to thematize that relationship). Plessner refers to this as the animal's "frontality."

Plessner has set the stage for his anthropology through developing a bio-logic based upon the dual aspectivity of even the simplest form of biotic positionality being taken to increasing levels of abstraction and detachment. Next I will focus on and explore what Plessner's method has to offer with respect to its account of the origins and basis of normativity (or "Spirit"). Plessner tells us that from its center the animal positions itself -- it gains mastery of its own lived body, "it is a system that refers back to itself, a self, but it does not experience-itself" (p. 267). The human sphere is defined by a jump from centric positionality to that further level of detachment that uniquely allows for that purchase upon its center that Plessner calls "excentric positionality." The human "I" which is the unique result of excentric positionality becomes the constant companion of human positional positing. It preserves, and inhabits its centered lived body, while also constituting its excentric detachment from its center by way of its reflexive awareness of its posited center.

Its life out of its center enters into a relationship to it; the reflexive character of the centrally represented body is given to itself. Although the living being on this level is also absorbed in the here/now, lives out of the center, it has become conscious of the centrality of its existence. It has itself; it knows of itself; it notices itself -- and this makes it an I. (pp. 269-70)

But just what is the nature of this excentric self-awareness? The center that reflexively (and reflectively) knows itself as such is intrinsically the perspective of the 'shared world', and as such a normative perspective. "We can thus say that the excentric form of positionality generates the shared world and guarantees its reality" (p. 280). Oddly, but interestingly, Plessner has derived a 'we' perspective, and the origins of 'spirit'/normativity monologically. The shared world has a transcendental, not an empirical status. It obtains even if only one person exists. "the spiritual character of the person is based upon the we-form of his own I, on the totally unified being-encompassed and encompassing of his own lived existence according to the mode of excentricity" (p. 281-2). Is it not the case then that this excentric I, which is the sine qua non of human personhood, is really a transcendental we?[4]

Plessner admits to a superficial resemblance with Hegel, but rather than an overcoming of subject-object dichotomies issuing into the halcyon realm of Absolute Spirit, Plessner's overcoming of subject-object dichotomies condemns the human to endless oscillatory instability -- in the world and against the world, in herself and against herself. Further, this perennially conflictual, and perhaps needlessly monological, grappling with a transcendental we bespeaks for Plessner the inevitable limits to the intimacy of any possible human community, a topic upon which he had already expounded upon in a previous work.[5] While I think that there is something to embrace and retain in the idea of a bio-logic of the conditions of possibility of a normatively oriented form of life and even in the concept of a transcendental we, I have argued in a number of places that the only empirically, theoretically and phenomenologically adequate way for achieving something along these lines is by focusing, not on the idea of the individual, but rather on the emergence by 'natural detachment' of the normatively integrated hominin group.[6]

[1] Habermas lectured on Plessner as part of a lecture course on Philosophical Anthropology that he delivered at Northwestern University in the autumn of 1998. For an account of Habermas's lectures on Plessner, see Lenny Moss "Helmuth Plessner" in Allen, A. & Mendieta, E. (eds.) 2019, The Cambridge Habermas Lexicon, Cambridge University Press.

[2] One may find a good example of this in the recent volume entitled Why we disagree about human nature (Hannon, E. & Lewins, T. eds., Oxford, 2018) which while presenting only a very limited range of views, and disagreements, performatively asserts that it has exhausted the topic. See also the NDPR review of this volume by Tim Ingold.

[3] Plessner, H. (1970) Laughing and Crying: A Study of the Limits of Human Behavior (J.S. Churchill & M. Grene trs.), Northwestern University Press, Evanston, IL.

[4] My term, not Plessner's.

[5] Plessner, H. (1999) The Limits of Community: A Critique of Social Radicalism (Wallace, A. tr.), Humanity Books, Amherst, NY.

[6] Moss, L. (2020) "Can Normativity be the Force of Nature that Solves the Problem of Partes Extra Partes? Episode IV -- A New Hope -- Natural Detachment and the Case of the Hybrid Hominin (2019) in Altobando, A. & Pierfrancesco, B. (Eds.) Natural Born Monads: On the Metaphysics of Organisms and Human Individuals Berlin: De Gruyter. Moss, L. (2017) "New Naturalism and Critical Theory" in Gare, A. & Hudson, W. (eds.) For a New Naturalism, Telos Press, NY, pp. 78-104. Moss, L. (2016) "The Hybrid Hominin: A New Point of Departure for Philosophical Anthropology" in Naturalism and Philosophical Anthropology. Honenberger, P. (ed.). Palgrave Macmillan, pp. 171-182.