Levinas and Buber: Dialogue and Difference

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Peter Atterton, Matthew Calarco, and Maurice Friedman (eds.), Levinas and Buber: Dialogue and Difference, Duquesne University Press, 2004, 320pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0820703516.

Reviewed by Michael Morgan, Indiana University


I waited for the publication of this volume with great anticipation. Levinas and Buber are two of the most important Jewish thinkers of the twentieth century, and yet we have no book or collection of essays in English that compares their contributions. Both are philosophically important, although Buber's philosophical significance has been much less appreciated, especially in North America. At first glance, a comparison of the two seems appropriate. Levinas privileges an interpersonal relationship he calls the face-to-face, Buber an encounter he calls I-Thou. Levinas wrote several pieces on Buber, and his discussions, while appreciative, are critical. He claims that Buber's conception of I-Thou is ethically formal and reciprocal, while the social relationship, for Levinas, is asymmetrical and ethically substantive, demanding responsibility and concern for the other's suffering and well-being. A straightforward comparison of their work is in and of itself an attractive thought, and an examination of what Levinas said about Buber and Buber's responses is also an intriguing project. When I saw the advertisement for the present volume, I was eager to read it.

Overall, the result is valuable, helpful, and informative. The questions and issues that the juxtaposition of the two thinkers raises deserve better, deeper treatment, to be sure, but there is a good deal to be learned from the essays, especially for someone coming to the comparison between Buber and Levinas for the first time.

The volume includes an introduction, jointly written by the three editors, and 15 essays, three by the editors. The essays are organized into four sections. In a short section entitled "Dialogue," the editors reprint an excerpt from Buber's autobiographical fragment originally printed in The Philosophy of Martin Buber and a comment of Levinas, from an interview, that refers to the autobiographical fragment, and especially to Buber's discussion of Samuel and Agag in I Samuel 15:33. Section Two is called "Ethics" (inadvertently in the Introduction it is referred to as "Ethics and Otherness); it includes five essays, all reprinted. Those by Stephan Strasser and Robert Bernasconi are well-known, even classic pieces. It appears that the Strasser essay is newly translated and is published here in English for the first time. Section Three is called "Religion" and contains five essays, one of which is reprinted. The final section, "Heidegger, Humanism, and the Other Animal," includes three new essays. Overall, then, eight of the fifteen contributions have appeared before, seven are new.

The collection does have a certain rhythm or even drama, although its development is not steady and firm; more than one thing is going on in the essays. The essays confront the encounter between Levinas and Buber with greater or lesser attention to the actual dialogue between the two thinkers. Clearly Bernasconi's masterful essay, structurally and substantively the richest in the volume, is at one extreme: it is explicitly about the dialogue between Levinas and Buber as a dialogue and considers precisely how what they say does or does not exemplify their understanding of what genuine interpersonal encounter requires. Others focus so independently on the work of each author that they pay no attention at all to their actual comments on one another. Secondly, the essays overall confront the two central questions raised by a comparative examination of their work, whether the ethical dimension of Buber's thought is formal and hence less deep than the ethical dimension of the Levinasian face-to-face, and whether there is a difference between the mutuality of the I-Thou and the asymmetry of the face-to-face and if so, what it means. Finally, the essays consider a variety of other ways in which Buber and Levinas are similar and differ, e.g., the fact that Levinas is rooted in a background of Lithuanian Talmudic learning and Buber in a background of Hasidic piety; the fact that Buber seeks a return to the Bible itself, without attention to traditional commentaries, whereas Levinas advocates a reading of the Bible through talmudic lenses; and the ways in which both are particularly responsive to the Nazi atrocities and their importance for Judaism and philosophy. Although these various strands are present in the volume, however, I would say that the main drama follows the path of the central ethical issues.

Rather than review the contents of each and every contribution, let me pick out a few and say something about what they accomplish.

Stephan Strasser's essay, "Buber and Levinas: Philosophical Reflections on an Opposition," is a very helpful overview of the differences between the two. He makes note of the difference in the types of Jewish life in which each is rooted and of their different ages and hence experiences. The core of the essay, however, focuses on philosophical issues: that Levinas takes Buber's I-Thou relationship to be formal, which Strasser claims is a misunderstanding; that for Levinas Buber's treatment of God is insufficiently transcendent; that Levinas takes Buber's I-Thou to be a symmetrical relationship and his account of its character to be highly spiritualist; and finally that the two differ regarding their views about the monotheistic revelation -- for Buber it is universal and can occur within the history of any number of peoples, whereas for Levinas it was a "one-time happening of super-historical significance" (47). In each case, Strasser states the problem succinctly and, when he can, attempts to address it.

Robert Bernasconi's essay is the most subtle and probably the richest in the volume. In his own words, he "surveys Levinas's numerous studies of Buber, and in particular compares an essay predating Totality and Infinity with another postdating Otherwise Than Being or Beyond Essence in order to explore both the continuity and change not simply in Levinas's understanding of what Buber wrote, but also in the way in which Levinas approached Buber" (65). I could not possibly do justice to the essay here. Suffice it to say that Bernasconi follows the exchange both philosophically and ethically, especially in terms of Levinas's changing attitude toward Buber.

As one might expect, Maurice Friedman defends Buber and seeks to show how inadequately Levinas has understood him and the "ethical adequacy" of his moral philosophy. His strategy is to approach Levinas's criticisms only after looking at Buber's works carefully. He points out that for Buber the I-Thou may be reciprocal or mutual, to one degree or other, but it is certainly not symmetrical or reversible. He quotes Buber as saying that "it is false … to say that the meeting is reversible" (119). Each I and each Thou is unique. My I is indebted to my saying Thou, which I take to be giving oneself and opening oneself to this particular Thou. It may be that in the I-Thou, we both give and we both receive, but, as Friedman sees it, each giving and receiving is unique and filled with content. Buber says that each I "recognizes and acknowledges, accepts and confirms" the particular Thou it addresses; he calls this "comradeship of the human creature" (120, quoted from The Philosophy of Martin Buber, 723). It is "confirm[ing] and further[ing] my Thou in the right of his existence and the goal of his becoming" (121, quoting Philosophical Interrogations, 27ff.). And since this can occur when the Thou is a plant or animal as well as a person, it is not always mutual or reciprocal to the same degree even if it is always symmetrical in some sense. Moreover, this giving of oneself occurs in response to the address of the other and the signs of that address. Friedman describes Buber's understanding this way: "Responsibility to Buber means hearing the unreduced claim of each hour in its crudeness and disharmony and answering it out of the depths of one's being" (123).

In the end, however, Friedman's attempts to formulate the ethical content of Buber's I-Thou and conception of human responsibility are metaphorical and uninformative, and even if we take them to mean something or to refer to some kind of articulable response, that response seems unexplained and unmotivated. One wants to know what counts as appropriate response or adequate response, when that to which one responds is characterized as the other person's being. And why respond to it when it confronts us? One might take Levinas to have answers to just these questions: that the other person's being is present always in terms of certain facts or roles or features about the other person and that prior to being confronted with any of these the other calls to the I and makes a claim upon it in virtue of which we are responsive and responsible.

The volume contains three essays on Buber, Levinas, and Judaism that I found informative, if not exciting, and sufficiently unburdened by excessive jargon to be generally helpful. Two deal with their different modes of interpreting the Biblical text, one by Michael Fagenblat and Nathan Wolski and another by Robert Gibbs. The third, by Tamra Wright, contrasts the two in terms of the use of the idea of theodicy, employing the work of Emil Fackenheim to carry out the contrast. All three of these essays, as I say, are helpful, even though they stay much too close to the surface of what Buber and Levinas do and say to expose the depth of their relationship.

Richard Cohen's "Buber and Levinas -- and Heidegger" is an intriguing piece of work. He notes that both Buber and Levinas are critics of Heidegger, but ironically "their respective critiques of Heidegger serve, at the same time, as their critiques of one another" (235). Thus begins Cohen's valuable, if truncated (the essay is excerpted from a longer one), exploration of how each accuses the other of a problematic fidelity to Heidegger and of why Levinas's critique is the more telling. A central Buberian criticism of Heidegger is that his thought clings to history and lacks the sense of transcendence needed to judge it; Heidegger is a victim of historicism, of a certain kind. Cohen spends the largest chunk of his essay discussing Buber's 1938 Jerusalem lectures "What is Man?", in which Buber presents four criticisms of Heidegger. First, Heidegger is largely concerned with the "relation of the individual to his own being" and is insufficiently attentive to the relation between the individual and other persons, i.e., the dialogical relation. But, as Cohen points out, Levinas criticizes Buber himself for not appreciating adequately the ethical character of that dialogical relation or interpersonal encounter. Second, Buber charges Heidegger's analysis of human existence as being too solitary, gripped by anxiety and dread. Third, Buber focuses on Heidegger's notion of care or solicitude, claiming that by itself this attitude or relation cannot be an "essential relation with the life of another" but rather must be "one man's solicitous help in relation with another man's lack and need of it … . In its essence solicitude does not come from mere co-existence with others, as Heidegger thinks, but from essential, direct, whole relations between man and man" (243, quoting Buber in Between Man and Man, 170-1). But, as Cohen argues, Levinas makes the same point against Buber, that the relation between persons is ethical before it is ontological. That is, Buber's "essential relation" is not yet an ethical relation, while Heidegger's solicitude is, when properly understood in Levinas's terms. Finally, Buber wonders whether there is a "primal social relation," a We that corresponds to the Thou of the I-Thou, or must we live with Heidegger's impoverished notion of community? Here Cohen turns to Buber's later book, Paths in Utopia (1949), to see whether he can give a rich enough account of community, but Cohen's final judgment on that account is that it is vague and romantic (248).

In the final essay in the volume, Peter Atterton's "Face-to-Face with the Other Animal?", Levinas's criticism of Buber -- that by allowing there to be I-Thou relations with anything, including plants and animals, Buber makes "saying Thou" a completely formal matter -- is turned on its head. Atterton shows that this openness to animals can be understood as a strength of Buber's account and a weakness of Levinas's philosophy. There are resources in Buber that are not available in Levinas for extending the ethical relation to animals in a significant way. This question, of Levinas's failure to respect sufficiently animal rights, is a controversial one. Atterton does a nice job of introducing the basic themes and texts and of showing some development in Levinas's thinking on these matters.

Running through many of these essays, then, is a central question: most deeply, why does Levinas object to Buber's I-Thou? What does it really mean to say that Buber never escapes ontology or the domain of totality? In what way is the I-Thou insufficiently ethical?

Several of the essays note that for Buber real living is meeting, that the core of the I-Thou is in the dialogue itself, i.e., in the relationship. But what does this mean? What constitutes the I-Thou encounter? Certainly it is unlike I-It relationships, in which the I is subject and the It object. In such everyday experiences, the subject and object are only partially present, each in terms of some role or function. And while the I-It does have a relational structure, i.e., it is a form of connectedness, indeed of intentionality, broadly conceived, the relation is unlike the genuine meeting or the "between" that characterizes the I-Thou. Let me propose, then, that in the I-Thou the I gives itself totally and unreservedly to the other, holding back nothing, with complete and unqualified acceptance of the other, and the other receives the I in the same way, without holding anything back and unqualifiedly. The I says Thou to the other; it accepts and welcomes, acknowledges and bestows itself. Moreover, to one degree or another, this giving and receiving is reciprocal. Hence, the totality of the I-Thou is constituted by this reciprocal giving-receiving or, as Buber often puts it, addressing and being addressed. Let us call this unreserved, unrestrained acceptance and generosity.

If this is a fair account, even if preliminary, of the I-Thou, we can see more clearly why Levinas might balk at it. As an ideal or preeminent human relationship, it leaves open two central questions: what gives rise to the act of generosity, the giving of one's self to an other? And what is the content of the relationship of mutual generosity? Regarding the first question, Buber, let us suppose, must take it to be spontaneous, an act of self-sacrificing freedom, prompted by the presence of an other but not in any way called for or demanded. For Levinas, this is a problem. Human freedom is always responsive to a situation. Acceptance or generosity is always a response to a situation and to an other. There may be moments when I give myself totally to an other, but this very act of responding to the other, of care and concern, is already called for, petitioned and commanded, so to speak. In a sense, then, for Levinas, Buber has not gone deep enough or far enough; he takes there to be nothing more fundamental or ideal or determinative than acts of unqualified generosity, of pure giving-receiving of self. Levinas disagrees; such moments of generosity may occur but in order for them to occur, as responses, they must be responses to something, to some demand or call, which always is already in place whenever an I faces another.

Buber thinks that Levinas's acts of feeding the hungry, clothing the naked, and caring for the orphan, the widow, and the stranger are already I-It engagements that lack a ground of relationship. Levinas uses these as illustrations of what happens in everyday life when we do in fact respond to the other as we should. In such acts, the face-to-face is disclosed more clearly than in much of our everyday social interaction. But the face-to-face is the transcendental character, as it were, of all human, social relationships. Buber might say that the real motive for feeding the hungry and reaching out to the suffering should be the sense of generosity present in the I-Thou, but Levinas would say that insofar as these are acts of generosity at all, they must be grounded in the very fact of our being responsible to and for the other who faces me, who confronts me with their hunger, their need, their existence. Moreover, for Buber such generosity has no content other than the giving and receiving of one's self. In fact, however, to Levinas giving is giving something to someone who needs it, and receiving is receiving what has been given in response to one's claim or petition.

There is a genuine disagreement here. For Buber, at the deepest level we are beings capable of unrestricted generosity; for Levinas, at that level we are beings called to be responsible to and for others. The issue is: which is more fundamental? Which is the deepest level of our social relatedness? Are we most fundamentally related as giving-receiving or as being-called-to-responsibility? I am not sure how to answer the question. Surely, one view might be understood as more optimistic about human capacities, the other less so. One view sees us as typically withholding ourselves when we could be more giving. The other sees us as being insufficiently responsive to others when we could be more giving. One sees ethics as grounded in freedom or spontaneity; the other sees it as grounded in demand and plea. While there may be considerations any one of us might call upon to favor one view over the other, I am unsure that any such considerations are completely compelling. One's choice between the two options might be dictated by one's sense of who we are, in our historical situation, given how we view the world and its character today. I for one am not as optimistic as Buber seems to be. Levinas speaks to me and convinces me that the social fact is ethical before it is anything else. The burden that falls upon us has always been there, once we recognize it for what it is.