Levinas and James: Toward a Pragmatic Phenomenology

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Megan Craig, Levinas and James: Toward a Pragmatic Phenomenology, Indiana University Press, 2010, 247pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780253222381.

Reviewed by Diane Perpich, Clemson University


Megan Craig's Levinas and James: Toward a Pragmatic Phenomenology is less an academic study of the two thinkers of the title or the two traditions of the subtitle than it is a personal journey of philosophical and aesthetic exploration. With a heightened sensitivity to images and mood, Craig rereads Levinas through the lens of James's radical empiricism, offering us a portrait of Levinas that is at once recognizable and new. Quoting James, Craig notes that philosophy "is more a matter of passionate vision than of logic," and her book clearly strives to embody the "more expansive, creative, and experimental notion of writing and reading" that James advocates (132). The book proceeds in six chapters whose titles are evocative rather than descriptive: a first approach to Levinas's thought is advanced in the two chapters titled "Insomnia" and "Faces." The connection to James's pragmatism is expanded in the middle chapters on "Experience" and "Emotion." The aesthetic dimensions of Levinas's work and their connection to ethical themes are explored in the final two chapters, respectively entitled "Poetry" and "Painting." These are followed by a concluding "Afterword" in which Craig helpfully summarizes the trajectory of the book and some of the positions it seeks to stake out.

A first rapprochement between Levinas and James is suggested in the initial two chapters of the book, where Levinas is described as moving away from classical phenomenology, with its careful description of the appearance of phenomena, toward a more "vital" (35) phenomenology, or what Craig also calls a "periphenomenology," that attends to those aspects of experience which "occupy an ambiguous middle ground between perceptual objects and cognitive thought" (47). In the first chapter, focusing on Existence and Existents, Craig amplifies Levinas's description of insomnia, showing how it serves as a foil to Heidegger's notion of anxiety -- "beginning a life's work of intensifying Heideggerian moods with fully embodied alternatives" (13) -- and exemplifies Levinas's notion of ethical subjectivity. The picture that emerges, of a subject constituted less through some solid core of identity than through its susceptibility, exposure, and vulnerability to the demand of the other -- is by now familiar to readers of Levinas's work, both early and late. Moreover, commentators before Craig have certainly noticed that the dramatic concepts of the early work (including the notoriously difficult notion of the il y a, a kind of being without either subject or object) recur in new guises in his later writings. What distinguishes Craig's account is not the substance of it, but the vivid manner in which she illuminates the insomniac's plight and makes this sleepless subject's fatigue palpable and alive.

Chapter Two brings a similar vividness to one of the most shopworn figures of the Levinasian imaginary: the face of the other. Taking her cue from a stray comment in Existence and Existents on the "hallucinatory dimensions" created by a close-up in film, Craig muses on the way this cinematic device decontextualizes a face, extracting it from its "world and setting in a horizon" (54), thus giving us a "dramatized experience of a face overflowing every frame that tries to contain it" (54). Levinas and James excels in moments such as these when it is able to reanimate Levinas's philosophy through densely textured, dramatic descriptions of its central concepts or notions. Craig suggests, moreover, that her method is borrowed from Levinas himself (though it is arguably James's influence at work here) -- a claim that becomes central to two related theses advanced in the book. First is the thesis, already mentioned, that Levinas does not so much take a distance from the phenomenological tradition or expose its limits, but that he inaugurates a new kind of phenomenology appropriate to everything that "remains barely visible and inarticulable, and yet [is] infinitely significant" (48). The companion claim says that this inchoate yet significant "something" is nothing extraordinary, nothing outside of experience; rather, it is the ordinary, everyday thickness of our human life together. Levinas's phenomenology, Craig concludes, thus "returns more deeply to the everyday and the concrete, even as it forces one to accept that life is fundamentally fluid, plural, and resistant to concretion" (67). In both cases, and I would suggest that this is true in a crucial respect for the book as a whole, the claims here work better as claims about what we can see when we look at Levinas through a Jamesian prism than as straightforward claims about Levinas's own views. What we find in Craig's book is not Levinas himself, plain and unvarnished; but Levinas as we might imagine him, when painting with the brush of radical empiricism.

In the third and fourth chapters, Craig turns most directly to the connections she wants to establish between James and Levinas. It is unclear to what extent Levinas would have had more than a passing familiarity with James; and though Craig mentions repeatedly that James's is "one of the first names" cited in Existence and Existents, she also notes that this is the only reference to James in all of Levinas's philosophy. The study is on firmer ground in casting Bergson -- who corresponded with James and was a significant influence on Levinas -- as a missing link between the two, though readers not familiar with this correspondence will wish for a more systematic introduction to the letters that passed between them and to what these thinkers might have shared philosophically or conceptually. Clearly, for example, both had an interest in creativity and the notion of intuition, but to what extent did they understand these terms in similar ways? And given that they did not share a common theory of perception or sensation, nor of action, how does that impact the relationship to Levinas? Beyond some intriguing conjectures about how James's work, filtered through Bergson, might be seen in tandem with Levinas's thinking, these chapters establish little in the way of a direct inheritance from James to Levinas. In lieu of a direct connection, two thematic similarities between Levinas and James become the focus of analysis: first, Craig claims James and Levinas see experiences not as a set of atomistic instances but in terms of a web of connective tissues or "conjunctive relations" (73). And, secondly, that thus seeing life as a "turbid, muddled, gothic sort of affair" (James's words), these two thinkers offer an ethics that is deeply responsive to concrete situations rather than dependent on abstract principles or rules (93).

There are difficulties attendant on the attribution of either of these claims to Levinas's thought. As Craig herself notes, the term "experience" has a contested role in Levinas's thought: the face, for example, "refuses to terminate in an experience" (102). Yet the relation to the face is also said to be "experience, par excellence" -- which prompted Derrida, as is well-known, to describe Levinas as engaged in a form of radical empiricism. This is nothing like the radical empiricism of James, however; and Craig perhaps skates over this difference too easily and quickly, ignoring her own warning about the difference between these thinkers. Statements like this one -- "To be a human subject in Levinas's account is to be able to feel more exposed and more alive, without any sense of whether this will feel better or worse" (109-110) -- seem far more accurate as a description of James's work than of Levinas's. Ethics for Levinas is arguably not a matter of what we feel, in the ordinary psychological meaning of that term. To write as if it is, is to miss entirely what is at stake in the admittedly tortured claims of Otherwise Than Being according to which the ethical relation is not something that presents itself to me, not even as the origin or arche or subjectivity. The ethical relation is an-archic, that is, without an origin in anything that is or could have been present to a subject and thus a matter of the subject's feeling something or other. While Craig's aim to deflate the high-flown rhetoric of Levinas's thought (and of too much of Levinas scholarship) is much to be admired, the risk is that she makes this thought all too pedestrian. For her, the upshot of Levinas's ethics is that we can or should become more "open" to the other. For James, this means "get out more, read more, meet more people, and subject yourself to more challenges;" for Levinas it is the even more minimalistic "holding the door open for someone and saying bonjour" (110). Surely it is not worth wading through Levinas's major works if this is what is to be learned there!

Another way to take the claims about ethical contextualism and the ordinary would be to think that neither Levinas nor James is in the business of making ethical prescriptions (a view which seems right), but rather their intent is to inspire us to be better in some fashion (a more debatable claim). Putnam reads Levinas this way, as does Michael Morgan with considerable sophistication. But the risk in this line of interpretation is that Levinas becomes little more than a pious moralist who might inspire us in our private lives but who is thus hardly engaged in a public or philosophical enterprise. This is not the place to argue for the latter point, but it is the place to note the considerable risk that attends the perfectionist reading and the reading that, like Craig's, tends toward seeing in Levinas something like a phenomenology of the ordinary.

The final two chapters of Levinas and James develop a Levinasian aesthetic and show how it compliments the ethical stance thus far developed. The chapter entitled "Poetry" combines reflections on the complicated question of Levinas's own view of art and poetry with an insistence that the ethical "openness" articulated in the preceding chapters requires the concomitant development of a certain aesthetic stance and aesthetic tools. In effect, the idea here is that form and content are inseparable in the understanding of Levinasian ethics: the "style and method" by which the ethical message is delivered in Levinas's works is said to be "as important, if not more so, than the content of that message" (132). In an interesting twist on standard discussions of Levinas's rejection of art and poetry, Craig points out that "Levinas's discomfort with the aesthetic is less a way of excluding it than a way of highlighting its powerful hold" (135). The images and rhetorical figures that pervade Levinas's writing -- seemingly in contradiction of his voiced opposition to rhetoric in Totality and Infinity -- are seen as disruptive forces, marking the interruption of a straightforward, linear meaning in order "to show something unsayable" (135). Craig nicely contrasts the "nomadic" aesthetics thus emerging from Levinas's thought with Heidegger's view of art as creating spaces that are inhabitable and sedentary -- spaces where we are entitled to, and claim, our place in the sun. But this difference is tempered when, in the final section of the chapter, we are told that art in Levinas, too, has a kind of saving power: the power to disorient us, but also to offer us a lifeline that can "ground" us as we grasp the positivity and hope that shines in the sheer power of the human to create.

In the final chapter, Craig turns to twentieth-century painter Phillip Guston's work as both embodiment of a Levinasian aesthetic and as a figure whose work can be critically enriched if considered in the light of Levinas's philosophy. A principal similarity between James, Levinas, and Guston is that all three are interested in a form of transcendence that does not lead one above or beyond the world, but rather "plants one deeper within it" (173). Moreover, none of the three provide a theory (ethical or aesthetic), but give us something else: "The value of their projects might best be described in terms of the feeling they each inspire that without clarity, truth, form, and beauty, there is still meaningful expression -- even if it is expression in ruins" (185-86). The discussion here tends to vacillate between the idea that Guston, Levinas, and James say the same thing and the idea that they complement or illuminate one another's work in productive ways. With respect to James and Levinas, the sharpest formulation of how the two are meant to be related comes in the middle of the chapter on emotion: "James does not give us a phenomenological pragmatism, and Levinas does not give us a pragmatic phenomenology; each contributes several elements of a perspective that has yet to be articulated" (101). Guston adds yet further elements and it is this emerging perspective -- which is properly neither James's nor Levinas's nor Guston's but Craig's -- that the reader would do well to ferret out and consider on its own merits.

Readers familiar with James and Levinas already will find much here that makes them consider these figures from a new angle or in new colors. Pragmatists will want to consider to what extent there is an ethics in James's work that lends itself to being thought about in Levinasian terms, while Levinasians will appreciate the ways in which embodiment and sensibility are defended as core components of Levinas's view. But the real merit of this study is the author's own passionate articulation of an ethics and aesthetics of everyday life that urges us to live "in greater intimacy with one another and our world" (198) and urges philosophy to the task of getting back in touch with those larger questions that animate everyday life (196).