Levinas and the Cinema of Redemption: Time, Ethics, and the Feminine

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Sam B. Girgus, Levinas and the Cinema of Redemption: Time, Ethics, and the Feminine, Columbia University Press, 2010, 272pp., $27.50 (pbk), ISBN 9780231147651.

Reviewed by Michael L. Morgan, Indiana University


The question that I kept before me as I was reading this book and preparing to write this review is whether philosophers can learn anything valuable from it. After all, it is a book written by someone who has published extensively on film, it treats various Hollywood and European films that are classics and certainly worthy of attention, and it purports to engage with the work of an important twentieth-century philosopher as part of its project. To be sure, one can learn something even from a book that has significant deficiencies, but what I have been asking myself is something different. It is whether a philosopher could learn anything positive from the book. Does the book say helpful and interesting things about Emmanuel Levinas? Does it show us how to explore films in the light of Levinas's philosophical work? Does it read films in a way that is philosophically novel and interesting, about film itself or about these particular films? I wish that I could answer "yes" to one or more of these questions, but I cannot. The most I can say is that in the course of reading what Girgus has to say about Levinas and the nine or so films he discusses, one is provoked to reflect upon a number of problems and issues concerning Levinas and film, and although Girgus has nothing particularly helpful to say about most of them, it is worthwhile to have them called to our attention.

In the course of the book's seven chapters Girgus discusses: Frank Capra's Mr. Smith Goes to Washington (1939) and It's a Wonderful Life (1946); John Ford's The Grapes of Wrath (1940); John Huston's The Misfits (1961); Robert Rossen's The Hustler (1961); Edward Zwick's Glory (1989); Philip Kaufman's The Unbearable Lightness of Being (1988); Federico Felini's La Dolce Vita (1959); and Michelangelo Antonioni's L'avventura (1960). He also briefly comments on Michael Curtiz's Casablanca (1942), Rossen's Body and Soul (1947), and Carol Reed's The Third Man (1949). He organizes his discussions of the films according to themes he finds in Levinas. For example, he uses the Capra films to show how the redemptive element in these films can be articulated using Levinas's notion of transcendence and responsibility to the other person, and he uses Levinas's notion of the face in order to clarify how to understand particular facial shots of Henry Fonda, Marilyn Monroe, Paul Newman, and Denzel Washington. His treatment of The Unbearable Lightness of Being, La Dolce Vita, and L'avventura attempts to use Levinas in order to clarify what the films tell us about art, ethics, love, sexuality, and gender. His most detailed and most comprehensive commentaries on the films are the last three, the European films. Girgus's basic project, then, is to identify and clarify themes in Levinas's philosophy in certain American films and to show how these themes are represented in European films that are also examples of what Girgus calls a "cinema of redemption."

There is an unclarity or confusion in Girgus's own mind about his project. At times he seems to be focusing exclusively on American, Hollywood films; at times, he expands his project to this genre of "cinema of redemption" conceived internationally. At one point he says that he is interested in showing joint illumination. But if one looks carefully, there does seem to be an overall plot to his story, especially the chapters on the European films, and he selects the films and orders his discussion in order to tell that story. One wonders whether the introduction of Levinas in order to organize the films and tell the story of redemption is not largely arbitrary. But this is a minor worry. A more pressing one concerns the genre itself.

This expression, the "cinema of redemption," refers to a number of films, from the 1930s through the 1960s and even later, that deal with individuals who struggle to overcome their self-interest and rampant individualism by coming to appreciate in themselves a sense of concern for others. In Girgus's terms, "these films of moral conflict and renewal reflect the response of American values to the multiple collective traumas of the Great Depression, the Second World War, and the cold war" (26), but as I indicated he also extends the category to include European films that respond to a century of war and cultural crisis. Personally, I think that the notion of redemption is probably too broad to be a helpful device for classifying films. If "redemption" involves identifying some evil or crisis or flaw, even more narrowly a moral one, and then proceeding to rectify the flaw or erase the evil, then it is so embracing a concept that it might include the vast majority of films produced during these decades. This is especially so if one treats the notion of redemption in both secular and religious terms. Girgus seems to want to narrow the field to a process within individuals, whereby they come to set aside their intense interest in themselves, their narcissism or egotism, in favor of some kind of altruistic concern for others. But even if we narrow the focus this way, it is a category that most likely includes an enormous number of films -- after all, stories about personal growth or development in this way are hardly unusual. Moreover, one wonders what about films that portray such a process would make them uniquely or distinguishably Levinasian.

This is surely one of the most problematic features of Girgus's book. His main purpose is to show how "in the sphere of ethical discussion the American version of the cinema of redemption and Levinasian ethical philosophy enlighten each other" (26). Most often, he describes what Levinas has to say -- whether it is by direct citation, quotation from secondary sources, or paraphrase -- in Levinas's own terms. There is virtually no clarification of crucial terminology or ideas. The ethical core of Levinas's thinking is never explicated; rather it is simply assumed in vague, impressionistic terms. Again and again we are told that Levinas advocates the priority of ethics and the relation to the other; he gives priority to transcendence and alterity. But these are simply slogans and by themselves quite empty. When it comes time, then, to find Levinasian moments in the films or to use Levinas in order to clarify what the film is saying, the transition to this task has little content and the application is unilluminating.

Moreover, since the Hollywood films which Girgus discusses -- especially the Hollywood films such as the Capra films, The Grapes of Wrath, and The Misfits -- are about the individual's development from self-interest to altruistic concern in the most general terms, we do not learn from the films what might be distinctive about how Levinas understands the ethical character of our interpersonal relationships with other persons. That is, Girgus does not tell us why a distinctively Levinasian reading of such development or "redemption" is appropriate or especially illuminating, nor do his readings of the films or episodes in them help us to understand what Levinas means by the face-to-face and its ethical import. In short, throughout the book, the appeal to Levinas to clarify what is going on in the films regularly seems utterly beside the point, arbitrary, and awkward. For example, referring to the American or Hollywood films, Girgus says "these films profess with almost a didactic regularity a transformation or conversion from egoistic self-obsession to transcendence based on others. In effect, they become lessons in Levinasian ethics and metaphysics" (34). He goes on to discuss Humphrey Bogart's "transformation" in Casablanca and John Garfield's in Body and Soul. But the summary of his reading of these two characters and their development is so imprecise and bland that it is hard to make out any relevance to understanding Levinas or vice versa: "The films in the American cinema of redemption vehemently profess such Levinasian 'wakefulness' to the importance of the moral and ethical dimension of human affairs. They place a priority on ethical relations and on adherence to human values" (58). The whole effort seems to me to exhibit the dangers of trying to use a philosopher's thinking to illuminate a reading of film. It can be done well, with rich and stunning results, or it can be artificial, vacuous, and clumsy, adding little if anything to reading film.

In the final pages of Chapter One, prior to turning to the main readings of the films, Girgus makes a transition from individual redemption to social and cultural redemption. He claims that films like the Capra films he will discuss combine these themes. He then cites Simon Critchley and other readers of Levinas to claim that such a social and political development can be derived from an encounter with Levinas's work. From them he introduces a notion of political "dissensus" [dissent or opposition?] that derives from a sensitivity to human rights. The Levinasian term he highlights is "responsibility." But once again, the notion of a responsibility to others or a responsibility to protect human rights is not grounded in any understanding of human relationships or what Levinas means by the face-to-face. It is simply pulled out of Levinas and his commentators and employed, as if the meanings of these terms and their ethical and political implications are transparent and can be used simply because a "similar" appreciation of a concern for others at the social and political level can be found in various Hollywood films.

Chapter Three is entitled "The Changing Face of American Redemption." It deals with Levinas's idea of the face of the other and four Hollywood stars in whose performances in four films Girgus finds examples of what Levinas means by the face -- Henry Fonda, Marilyn Monroe, Paul Newman, and Denzel Washington. After introductory sections on the close-up, the face and the cinematic image, and Levinas on the face, Girgus turns to cinematic moments when a close-up of each star exhibits something he associates with the face in Levinas. In the case of Henry Fonda in The Grapes of Wrath, for example, he focuses on the close-up of Fonda's face during his "I'll be everywhere" speech as Tom Joad. Girgus comments on

the intensity of Fonda's deep, piercing eyes, the powerful purposefulness of his stare, and the mixture of sensitive fragility and aggressive intent in his look and bearing [that] make for a performance that puts an unforgettable face on Tom's words of ethical and political embattlement (88).

Girgus then, a page later, says that

the gap between Fonda's physical face and the face of the fictional Tom compares to the space between the face and the Levinasian visage… . Fonda, in his portrayal of Tom, becomes the face of redemption. As Tom Joad, the face of Henry Fonda insists on an answer for the meaning of life (89).

At best, Girgus is confusing and at worst he is totally confused about what Levinas means by the face and the face-to-face encounter of the self with the other. It is possible that he is saying that the mysterious combination of intensity, fragility, and commitment in Fonda's face as Tom Joad delivering that speech represents something beyond any physical features -- moral obligation and responsibility or something like it. If so, then Girgus is very confused about what Levinas means by the face. On the other hand, it is possible that what Fonda's portrayal, as vulnerable and yet demanding, does is to engage with each of us viewers and that this is what Girgus means by saying that Fonda as Tom Joad "insists" on "an answer" from us, i.e., a response and hence responsibility. For Levinas, the face is that "hidden" aspect or dimension of our complex ordinary relationship with each other person that makes a claim upon us to respond and to take responsibility, to help and assist, to acknowledge and accept the other. That is, if Girgus thinks that Fonda as Tom Joad is teaching us something about the importance of our responsibility to others by depicting a powerful expression of concern, then he is wrong about what the face means for Levinas. And if he thinks that Fonda as Tom Joad is making a claim upon each of us, then he is on the road to being right about what Levinas means. But he is at best confusing, since he nowhere clearly points out that the crucial face-to-face at work in this cinematic moment is that between the actor and his portrayal, the cinematic image, and the viewer. Moreover, he does not even ask how Tom, in the film, is related to those who are listening to him. To be sure, while Tom Joad in the film makes a claim on those listening to him, Fonda as Tom Joad makes a claim upon each of us, the viewer. Girgus is not at all clear about such distinctions and their importance.

One finds a similar confusion in Girgus's discussion of Marilyn Monroe in The Misfits. He refers to her as the "face of the ethical argument" of the film. He says that the images of her in the film "invoke a radical ethical appeal for infinite responsibility from the men in the film who seek to find their redemption in her … Her face becomes the focus of that ethical demand" (93). Here too Girgus never clarifies the difference between what Monroe's image claims of the viewer and what it claims of the three men in the film; his descriptions confuse how she is present to them with how she is present to us, the viewers. And he confuses communicating a lesson or an argument to someone with making a claim upon someone. Indeed, by and large Girgus's lengthy discussion of The Misfits and of Marilyn Monroe's performance in it never helps us to understand the face but rather functions as a general reading of the film and especially of Roslyn's character as exemplifying concern for others, sensitivity, and empathy. It is a good example of how little is illuminated by adding Levinas to the reading.

For me, the chapters on the three European films, The Unbearable Lightness of Being, La Dolce Vita, and L'avventura, were the most interesting and rewarding in the book. Basically, Girgus gives us straightforward readings of these films, and they are very helpful readings at that. His treatment of sexuality, femininity, love, and ethics in these films combines close reading of the films with observations from other readers, historical context, and more. The best use of Levinas comes, I think, in the last chapter, but it is not so much a use of Levinas as it is a use of the controversy over Levinas's treatment of the feminine in his early work and the criticisms of it. Girgus tries to show that Antonioni is concerned in L'avventura with women, love, sexuality, and fulfillment, and it is helpful to turn to the criticisms of Levinas's subordination of women in Time and the Other and Totality and Infinity to expose the dialectic and the development in the story of Anna and Claudia, for L'avventura is really their story together and about the growing sense of what love and fulfillment mean for Claudia.

Early in his career, in his famous essay "Reality and Its Shadow," Levinas is very critical of art; later his appreciation for literature and art seems to have become increasingly positive. Film, then, is one province in which Levinas's puzzling relation to art can be assessed. Recently, there has been an effort on the part of a few philosophers and film theorists to draw Levinas and film together for mutual illumination. Most notably, there is a special issue of the journal Film-Philosophy edited by Sarah Cooper and a fascinating book on the Dardenne Brothers by Joseph Mai.[1] Within the context of such developments, Girgus's book promised to be a watershed. He does address central themes in Levinas -- transcendence, responsibility, the face, the role of time, and Levinas and feminism; he is a prominent author on film; and he has read Levinas and much commentary on him. But Girgus's execution of his task is insufficiently deep and helpful about Levinas and inadequate when it comes to applying Levinas to the reading of film. We still await a thoughtful, sensitive, and serious book on Levinas and film.

[1] The special issue of Film-Philosophy is 11,2 (August, 2007). Also, Joseph Mai, Jean-Pierre and Luc Dardenne (University of Illinois Press, 2010).