Levinas and the Night of Being: A Guide to Totality and Infinity

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Raoul Moati, Levinas and the Night of Being: A Guide to Totality and Infinity, Daniel Wyche (tr.), Fordham University Press, 2017, 217pp., $100.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780823273195.

Reviewed by James Mensch, Charles University


As is well known, Levinas's relations with Husserl and Heidegger were nothing if not fraught. In Totality and Infinity, we find multiple criticisms of these authors, and Levinas is at pains to distinguish his approach from theirs. Yet his own procedures are unintelligible without the contexts and, in some cases, the methods of these philosophers. Thus, with regard to Husserl, Levinas employs the methods of phenomenological analysis to brilliant effect in describing the genesis of our selfhood. Particularly striking are his descriptions of our sensuous affective life and the sensuous interiority that forms the singularity of our selfhood. Similarly, his description of the caress stands unrivaled as an analysis of the constitution of the object of sexual desire. Here, as elsewhere, one can only agree with Levinas when he writes: "the presentation and the development of the notions employed owe everything to the phenomenological method" (TI 28).[1] Yet Levinas is also insistent that Husserl's attempt to link the appearing of the object to our acts of syntheses fails to grasp the other person as she is "according to herself." Husserl's "noetic-noematic" correlation, which sees the sense of the object as correlated to our acts of sense-making, conceals the essential otherness of the Other. Levinas repeats this pattern of acceptance and rejection with Heidegger. For Levinas, as for Heidegger, the fundamental fact of our existence is our being-in-the-world. We are an embodied finitude that makes sense of the things that surround us through pragmatic disclosure. Their sense, in such disclosure, is given by the use we put them to: the wind is wind in the sails; the water has its sense as water to drink, to wash with, and so on. Yet, Levinas also insists that such disclosure is incapable of grasping the other person.

Derrida, in his attempt to deconstruct Totality and Infinity, focuses on this ambiguity. In his famous essay, "Violence and Metaphysics," he accuses Levinas of employing (and, hence, presupposing) the very means that he philosophically disavows. If the other person cannot be phenomenologically grasped, then he cannot appear. Levinas, then, "deprives himself of the very foundation and possibility of his own language. What authorizes him to say 'infinitely other' if the infinitely other does not appear as such?" (VM 125).[2] As these remarks indicate, the crux of the issue concerns Levinas's use of "infinity" in describing the other person's alterity. If this signifies a total alterity, then, as Derrida remarks, every Other would be "totally other" and we would be at a loss to distinguish between them (GD 69).[3]

These considerations are essential for understanding Raoul Moati's book which focuses on what Moati calls "nocturnal events," events that escape the "light" of phenomenological analysis. As Jocelyn Benoist writes in the "Foreword", Moati's "reading, as strong as it is novel, frees Totality and Infinity from the obstacle of what I would call its 'phenomenological recuperation'" (xiii). What this signifies is that "the Other does not at all appear . . . It does not 'exceed' phenomena, any more that it 'saturates' them, because, quite simply, it is something other than a phenomenon". It is, in fact, the nonappearing ground of phenomena since "without this nonphenomenon, no phenomena could have a sense, because no phenomena could then be spoken" (xiv). With this, we have an indication of the type of "guide" that Moati is offering us. It is a guide to the nonappearing, to the nocturnal underworld that supports the daylight of phenomena appearing.

The journey, much like Dante's in the underworld, is perilous. Moati, acting as our Vergil, is not a guide for the fainthearted or those who lack a grounding in Levinas's text. At times, the repetitious, almost incantational prose appears as an energetic attempt to hack one's way through an almost impenetrable wilderness. One often has to pause before sentences of extreme density.

What makes the journey more difficult is a certain ambiguity in Moati's approach. Levinas's accounts of sensation, dwelling, labor, and the welcoming Other, as well as his descriptions of sexual desire and the parent-child relation, present an alternative to Husserl's descriptions of the life-world. For Husserl, the conception of the life-world occurs in the context of the split, introduced by Galileo, between the primary and secondary qualities of reality. The primary are those that can be handled mathematically. The secondary are those given by our five senses -- the tastes, smells, colors, textures, and sounds of the world that our embodied senses afford us. These are the "qualia" that fill our consciousness. Science's attempt to reduce the secondary to the primary -- for example, its reduction of colors to the frequencies and amplitudes of electromagnetic waves -- is also a reduction of consciousness. To assert that reality consists in the mathematical relations between the primary qualities -- mass, charge, velocity, etc. -- is, according to Husserl, to deny any reality to the consciousness that is composed of sensuous contents. But this is to make its human origin -- i.e., our consciousness -- unintelligible.

Husserl's response is to bracket science and regard the world in its direct appearing -- i.e., to return to the world in its secondary qualities. This, however, is also the world that Levinas focuses on in his descriptions of sensation and, more broadly, in his account of how sensation implies both our embodiment and the uniqueness of our sensuous interiority. As Moati's commentary shows, the effect of this alternate account is to undermine Husserl's attempts to understand the life-world in terms of transcendental subjectivity -- a subjectivity that is somehow prior to and constitutive of appearing. To do so, however, Moati has to both embrace and deny the phenomenological analysis that Levinas engages in. Is such analysis "nocturnal" or not? How are we to understand Levinas's relation to phenomenology?

The issue comes to a head in Levinas's treatment of objective knowledge. Since Kant's time, objectivity has been defined in terms of intersubjectivity. Thus, the objective world differs from the private, subjective world by being there for more than a single person. The basic insight here is that when a person doubts that something he perceives is objectively real, he normally asks another person if she sees what he does. If she does not, then the person assumes that what he sees is a subjective illusion. Levinas draws several points from this intersubjective character of objectivity. The first is that, since I cannot see out of another person's eyes, I can only confirm my perception by speaking to another observer. Given this, we have to say that the objective world, the world that we share in common, has a linguistic, rather than a perceptual presence. Our access to it is through discourse. As Levinas puts this: "the objectivity of the object and its signification [as objective] come from language" (TI 96). Now, if the Other's consciousness and my own were identical, there would be no point in asking her if she sees what I do. Not only would she not add anything to my own perceptual evidence, her consciousness and my own would, in their identity, collapse into the same consciousness. Thus, the objectivity of the world depends upon the alterity of the Other -- i.e., on her capability of adding a fresh perspective. Behind such alterity, as Levinas stresses, is the embodied selfhood of the Other.

Husserl, in his account of intersubjective recognition, sees the physical distance which separates my position as "here" from the Other's position as "there" as crucial for my recognizing the otherness of the Other. Since I cannot view the world from two different places at the same time, I must, according to Husserl, grant the Other, who confronts me over there, a consciousness other than my own. Levinas goes beyond this in focusing on the embodiment that anchors the unity of our consciousness. The alterity of the Other is not just a matter of her being in a different position in space; it is a function of the sensuous interiority that defines us in our enjoyment of the world. Such interiority is not a public object. When, for example, one bites into a fresh peach, the flavor that suffuses one's mouth is present to oneself alone. This individuality also marks one's perceptions of the external world.

How, then, do individuals confirm one another's perceptions? Moati often speaks as if the tie to perception were inessential. But Levinas's position is much more nuanced. He writes: "The Other, the signifier, manifests himself in speech by speaking of the world and not of himself; he manifests himself by proposing the world, by thematizing it" (TI 96). What he thematises is, first of all, the sensuous presence of what he perceives. Beyond this, it is the sense of the perceived as given by his pragmatic projects. In presenting the world to me, he thus also presents himself in his enjoyment and use of the world. I, in talking with him, do the same.

What is crucial for Levinas is that our conversation is ongoing. Because it is, "the proposition that posits and offers the world does not float in the air, but promises a response to him who receives this proposition". One doesn't just receive the proposition from the Other, one also receives "the possibility of questioning" him. Ongoing discourse is, thus, "an ever renewed promise to clarify what is obscure in the utterance" (TI 97). As such, it maintains the ongoing presence of the objective world. It stands at the origin of its objectivity because it continually impinges on my viewing it simply in terms of my enjoyment and my private projects -- in short, my freedom to use the world as I will. The restraint on my freedom that comes from the Other's correcting my perspective through his own thus opens up a space for the object to show itself, not according to me, but "according to itself." Such showing is linguistic, but it is not cut off from its phenomenological base of enjoyment and use. What stands behind the ongoing nature of discourse that presents the object as it is in itself is the fact that each of the interlocutors, in speaking, presents himself "according to himself." The alterity of the speakers, the fact that each, in his particular grasp of the world, exceeds his interlocutor, is what yields the alterity of the world. It is what makes it irreducible to any individual, subjective apprehension. At such, it becomes "objective" in the German sense of the word, "Gegenständlich," i.e., capable of standing against the subject.

With this, we come to the crucial element of Levinas's position in Totality and Infinity: the concept of infinity. Does this involve something totally other or does it involve an "excess," a surpassing of what we can phenomenologically grasp? Moati's position on this is clear. He writes: "There is thus no sense in measuring the excessiveness of the infinite from the perspective of intentionality in order to understand the former as that which escapes the latter" (124). The infinite exists in an entirely different register. We thus commit an "error, on the level of principle, in describing the alterity of the Other as an excess with regard to intentionality: that of quite simply measuring negatively, that is, in the light of intentionality, measuring that which cannot in principle be measured" (188).

What would it be like to measure the Other "as an excess with regard to intentionality"? Moati does not say. There is, however, an answer if we view the matter in terms of Husserl's concepts of intention and fulfillment. In intending an object, a number of possible results can obtain. The givenness or perceptual fulfillment of what we intend can exactly match our intentions. It can be other than what we intend -- as is the case when we are mistaken. The givenness also can be less. It can, for example, not offer the detail that was part of our intentions. Finally, givenness can exceed our intentions. In showing itself, the object presents us with more than what we intended.[4] To intend the object as having such excessive presence is, paradoxically, to intend it as exceeding our intentions. Such presence has a peculiar quality. It makes us aware that more is being offered than we can formulate in our intentions. The interpretations based on our previous experience are not sufficient to grasp the sense it embodies. We have to adjust our interpretation and return to the object again. In such a return, however, we face the same situation. Yet another return is called for. The "object" that continually demands such a return is, of course, not an object, but a person.

For Levinas, the excess or "surplus" the Other offers us is given through his conversation. What he says is not totally other -- if it were, his speech would be unintelligible. It is, however, additive. The other person constantly adds to the givenness of the "said," by adding a new saying. In talking to me, the other person resists the "totalization," that would make him exactly match my intentions. This resistance, he writes,

is not due to the obscure and hostile residue of alterity, but, on the contrary, to the inexhaustible surplus of attention which speech, ever teaching, brings me. For speech is always a taking up again of what was a simple sign cast forth by it, an ever renewed promise to clarify what was obscure in the utterance (TI 97).

This is a position that Levinas never tires of repeating. Conversation that is genuine consists of the constant surplus of the saying over the said. What was said "seems to contain the other." "But," Levinas adds, "already it is said to another who, as interlocutor, has quit the theme that encompasses him." This Other rises up "behind the said." "Emancipated from the theme that seemed a moment to hold him," he "forthwith contests the meaning I ascribe" to him (TI 195). Levinas' claim here is that transcendence is inscribed in this relation because of the infinity of the Other. Such infinity designates the Other's non-limited character. It signifies his crossing the limits that I have laid down in making him my theme. What we have in conversation is, then, "an incessant surplus that accomplishes the infinitude of infinity" (TI 218). Such a surplus, we should note, is crucial for understanding Levinas's concept of Desire. Desire distinguishes itself from need in its incapacity to be satisfied. Whatever it achieves only inflames it. According to Levinas, it "does not arise from a lack or a limitation but from a surplus, from the idea of Infinity" (TI 210). The notion of a surplus is crucial. It implies both the addition and what this is added to. As such, it keeps the conception of the infinite from falling into the anonymity of the totally other. The Other surpasses phenomenological givenness (his presenting a world in the said), not by being totally other, but by presenting, in a further saying, a givenness that exceeds this.

In his "Conclusion", "Metaphysics and Givenness," Moati discusses this conception of the infinite. It is here that the specter that haunts his analysis of Levinas makes its appearance. The specter is Derrida's claim that Levinas deprives himself of the right to speak of the nonappearing Other. According to Derrida, Husserl has this right since his concept of intentionality embraces the notion of excess, of constant surplus. This, at least, is Moati's reading of Derrida's position, which he attempts to counter in his "Conclusion." In his view, "Violence and Metaphysics" is hardly intelligible without clarification from Derrida's 1962 Edmund Husserl's Origin of Geometry: An Introduction (183-4). Here, Derrida attributes to Husserl a conception of intentionality as an "anticipatory structure," one where "intentionality is inscribed within the horizon of a task of infinite constitution" (184). Given this concept, Husserl, in Derrida's view, can be seen as "demonstrating the irreducibility of intentional incompleteness, and therefore of alterity" (VM 120). Because of this, "Husserl gives himself the right to speak of the infinitely other as such, accounting for the origin and the legitimacy of his language. He describes the phenomenal system of nonphenomenality" (VM 125). Such a system shows through phenomenality what escapes phenomenality. The infinitely other exhibits itself in the incompleteness of the attempts to fix its presence. Infinity, here, means being unending; it does not mean being absolutely other. This is the force behind Derrida's question, "What authorizes [Levinas] to say 'infinitely other' if the infinitely other does not appear as such . . . ?". For Husserl, it does appear in escaping its appearances.

Moati, as is to be expected, rejects this critique. To embrace this Husserlian position is to commit an "error, on the level of principle" -- that of "describing the alterity of the Other as an excess with regard to intentionality" (188). For him, the Other is the condition, rather than the result of intentionality. Given this, "we cannot see how that which conditions the deployment of intentionality would be indebted to any level of intentionality". Who is correct: Moati or Derrida? It may be that neither one is. This would be the case if the position that Derrida attributes to Husserl were actually Levinas's own. For a reader who is interested in deciding for herself, Moati's book provides an invaluable resource.

[1] Totality and Infinity, An Essay on Exteriority, trans. Alphonso Lingis. Duquesne University Press, 1969; cited throughout as TI.

[2] "Violence and Metaphysics," in Writing and Difference, trans. Alan Bass (University of Chicago Press, 1978), pp. 79-153; cited as VM.

[3] The Gift of Death, trans. David Wills (University of Chicago Press, 1995), p. 68; cited as GD.

[4] Suppose, for example, one looks across the store and regards what one takes to be a mannequin displaying the store's wares. On approach, however, it turns out to be a sales person. She turns to address you and, in that very act, exceeds your intentions.