Levinas and the Postcolonial: Race, Nation, Other

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John E. Drabinski, Levinas and the Postcolonial: Race, Nation, Other, Edinburgh University Press, 2011, 206pp., $100 (hbk), ISBN 9780748641031.

Reviewed by Deborah Achtenberg, University of Nevada, Reno


Because Emmanuel Levinas's writing performs what it describes -- the breakup of knowledge that constitutes the ethical -- it has a powerful impact on some readers who find themselves called by the work to bracket their ideas, frameworks and interests in the non- or precognitive movement of spirit toward singular others that Levinas variously calls openness, respect for exteriority, straightforwardness, denucleation or being-for-the-other. Many such exponents also find themselves puzzled or disturbed, though, when they try to square Levinas's notion of the ethical with other ethical or ethico-political ideas that have obvious appeal and importance but involve improving our awareness of others rather than putting it on hold. Additionally, Levinas himself sometimes imposes categories on others in what we might call an imperialist fashion -- for example, in his comments critical of cultures summed up as "dance" (5). As a result, the interpreter who wants to utilize Levinas's work to think about ethical relations to others in a postcolonial, neocolonial. globalized context has a major exegetical job to do -- and, given that many interpreters of Levinas want to utilize his work in exactly that context, the job is an important one for Levinas scholarship in general.

As the title suggests, John Drabinski's Levinas and the Postcolonial: Race, Nation, Other takes on just such a task. Drabinski is an important exponent of Levinas's work out of the phenomenological tradition, who also has made substantial contributions in postcolonial and global frameworks, especially focusing on francophone theories and approaches. Some directions available to such an interpreter include: seeing Levinas's ethics as a kind of ur-ethics needed by or prior to other, more cognitive ethics; seeing Levinasian ethics as only one type or region of the ethical to be supplemented by other types or regions; separating Levinas's more imperialistic claims, many of which occur in essays rather than in his major works, from his main trajectory and seeing them as failings of personal judgment or of judgments common to his generation of post-holocaust thinkers; solving the problem of the need for more cognitively oriented ethical-political approaches by finding them already present in Levinas's concept of the political.

If I understand Drabinski's approach correctly, it follows the first direction mentioned above, seeing the Levinasian ethical as something like a necessary precondition for ethical action, not a complete description of what such ethical action is. For example, for Drabinski, Levinasian ethical interruption is a general condition for the ethical in opposition to the desire to know, which is "an expression of an all-encompassing and deeply problematic ideology of conquest, control, and possession" (51). More specific issues regarding otherness, moreover, are important because of this prior conception of the ethical: "the urgency of the question of hybridity," for example, "depends on a sense of the ethical" (11). By this Drabinski apparently means that without the fundamental disruption or denucleation that puts our comfortable categories in question, there would be no impetus to make ourselves aware of specific forms of difference such as hybridity, subaltern lack of contact with narrative, etc.

In addition, Drabinski clearly rejects the idea that a type of generational blind spot can help us much in understanding and coming to terms with Levinas's failings. Drabinski takes his bearings on this from Enrique Dussel's claim that Europe cannot be understood apart from its exploitation of Latin America, and he argues that Levinas overidentifies Europe with the ethical by utilizing a conception of Europe as "the Bible and the Greeks" (5), rather than understanding Europe as a center with Latin America as its constitutive periphery (2 ff). According to Drabinski, Levinas argues, "one is a responsible being because one is European, made of the Bible and the Greeks" (5). Such a standpoint on Europe, and not a generational shift, accounts for Levinas's culturally imperialistic claims and for some important limits in his work, Drabinski argues. As Martinican theorist Edouard Glissant asks, what is Europe without the "entanglements of modernity"? (7). Drabinski is struck by the fact that Levinas is so unconcerned about the important anti-colonial struggles taking place in his time, for example, the Algerian struggle for independence, a struggle that motivated other French intellectuals to take sides or take a stand (1).

Included by Drabinski among the thinkers whose views we can utilize to concretize our general Levinasian ethical concerns are theorists, such as Dussel, Glissant, Walter Mignolo, Gustavo Gutiérrez, who point to Europe's need for resources and its origins and constitution therefore in slavery, plantations, and managerial, bureaucratic and calculative types of thought. Carrying out such a concretized interpretation requires thinking about the central importance of embodiment. Because people are embodied, they need resources and, according to Drabinski, no one's existence can be summed up, abstractly or ethereally, as "the Bible and the Greeks". We need an "incarnate historiography" instead, something Levinas, with his supposition of "the unquestioned priority of Europe" lacks (46).

Moreover, Levinasian ethics does not respond to Gayatri Spivak's discussion of the gendered subaltern or to the ethics of hybridity described by Homi Bhabha and others. What Levinas does so well -- articulating or exposing the idea of the loss of one's center required for any ethical action -- must be supplemented by awareness of more concrete types of ethical failing. The Levinasian other addresses us from outside the world. Within the world, on the contrary, our bodies register our particular wounds which must be noticed to be addressed. They are not addressed simply through putting our frameworks out of play. Such an approach reduces painful memory and history to nothing (38).

In addition, what is Drabinski's point, exactly, about the role of thinking hybridity or gendered subalternity for ethics? I think the point may be summarized as the claim that there is a need to understand specific ways that frameworks exclude others in order to know when bracketing is needed to be ethical. In our post- or neocolonial age, alienation results from overvaluation of discrete identities and ideas and a rejection of flexibility and fluidity. Hybridity disrupts our very sense of place not to mention the stability and centrality of our sets of fixed concepts. It undermines fantasies of domination (118). An abstract ethics of denucleation is not enough to deal with this problem, however. The Levinasian ethical must engage with or arise from such specific cultural questions (121). The interstitial must supplement denucleation (124). Levinas can provide the general idea of ethical disruption, but his work cannot facilitate an awareness of how specific types of framework persistently prevent sensitivity to difference. Nor can his work provide the best figures for overcoming such persistently problematic frameworks or perspectives. Subcommandante Marcos's use of the figure of the rhizome, for example, serves us better than abstract ideas of denucleation due to the rhizomatic combination of differentiation and connection in our relation to others that we need in our increasingly globalized existence (179, 192).

There is much more to appreciate and comment on in Drabinski's book -- including his readings of Fanon, Glissant, Marcos and Spivak -- but it is important as well in a short review to raise the question whether Drabinski's identification of Levinas centrally with the valorization of Europeanness, which identification provides the background for much of the book's argument, itself needs interrogating. Levinas frequently identifies the West with Greek and opposes it both to Hebrew and to his ethics of disruption that is inspired or loosely affiliated with Hebrew thought, where both of the latter are understood as non-Western. What accounts for this ambiguity or vacillation, this hesitation about whether to identify the Hebrew with an aspect of what is European or see Hebrew as marginalized otherness? What accounts for Levinas's vacillation, if it is not inappropriate to personalize it, between seeing himself as European and as one of Europe's others?

Of course, Jewish identity is fluid differently from at least some other kinds of marginalized identity. How it is different has been variously characterized, but one focus in recent work on the topic is on how the categorization of Jews plays back and forth between dominant and marginalized. Within ethnic studies, the question of how Jews became white is an example. Within discussions perhaps closer to Drabinski's own interests in francophone literature and theory, Hélène Cixous's meditations in, for example, Reveries of the Wild Woman: Primal Scenes, on the variations in how her identity as a Jew was constructed by others in Algeria, are apropos. As she describes it, in her childhood Jews were marginalized by the French for being Jewish and by the Arabs for being French. We might wonder whether it is, in fact, relatively typical for Jews to be excluded because they are considered marginal by the dominant group and dominant by the marginal group and whether this is a central way in which Jewish marginalization functions. We might also wonder whether Drabinski's identification of Levinas with a concept of Europe -- "Levinas's work," Drabinski says, is "structured from within by his idea of Europeanness" (159) -- and insensitive as a result to the otherness of non-European peoples is not in fact an example of such a blunt way of constructing Jewish identity, specifically, one in which Levinas, because he is not a colonial subject, and therefore not in one of the principal marginalized groups, is assimilated instead to the dominant, European group. In this vein, Drabinski oddly describes Levinas's narrative of loss in the Shoah as a European narrative following a "European model of trauma and loss" (149), and he also, wildly, asserts that "Levinas's work is exclusively concerned with European thinkers" (159) despite Levinas's numerous Talmudic readings.

In this regard, it is also appropriate to turn to a different strain of thought in Drabinski's book, namely, the concern whether it is possible to separate the ethical and the political in the way that Levinas wants to do. One could argue that it is there that we find the central problem, rather than in confusions about what Europe is. Drabinski, in chapter 5, turns to Jacques Derrida for a solution to this problem -- Derrida who endeavors, out of a rejection of the idea that ethics can be separated from politics, to punctuate the political with Levinas-style interruptive ethical concerns (188-89). If the separation of the ethical from the political is the source of the abstract or ethereal quality of the ethical in Levinas's thought, as Drabinski suggests, how central a problem for his major works are his comments on Europe? Perhaps at a certain point Levinas began to over-identify with a fantasized Europe (91) and misapplied his own basic teachings on otherness as a result. I am not sure this position is correct, and I am not arguing it in this review, but I am suggesting that such a position, if it were appropriate -- and Drabinski in my view has done nothing to show that it is not -- would go a certain distance in explaining some of the ethnocentrism found in Levinas's minor works without affecting how we think of his major works. The critique of his major works might best be carried out, instead, through the kind of thinking Drabinski does on the question of the relation of ethics and politics. What views do we bracket and when? In what circumstances is the Levinasian reduction of the said needed? What, in other words, are our blind spots? Drabinski makes a convincing case for the answer to these questions having been articulated rather well by various postcolonial thinkers of difference. But his characterization of Levinas's thought as fundamentally European ("structured from within by his idea of Europeanness") does not seem to be adequately influenced by thinkers of Jewish difference, giving some of his critical comments about Levinas an undertheorized quality.

Similarly, we could locate the central problems in Levinas's major work in his sometimes problematic ideas regarding embodiment that Drabinski discusses. Drabinski might put more emphasis on this issue, too, and on finding its sources in Levinas's thinking. In one respect, Levinas is sensitive to the importance of body, insofar as he locates our ability to respect otherness in our sensibility. The ethical is sometimes understood by Levinas as giving the very bread from our mouths to the hungry. How can we square that very powerful locus of ideas in Levinas's corpus with the other aspects of his work that are disembodied and dismissive of bodily concerns?

Drabinski sees the anti-body components of Levinas's work -- for example, when he writes off dance as if it "were somehow abject or uninteresting" (5) -- as part of the work's Europeanness (4-6). But are they? Here, too, given Levinas's own subject position as a European Jew -- a type of hybrid identity -- such claims need further development. To what extent are they European? To what extent do they, possibly, result from the influence of a certain strain of Jewish thought? Could they instead result from a combined pro- and anti-body stand that is peculiar simply to Levinas?

Drabinski touches on the second possibility in passing when he says "the religious structures and destructures in ways we cannot but see as chauvinistic, even just plainly violent, in a transnational context. Condemning everything as 'just dance,' after all, is not free of religious underpinning; it might be blatantly so, in fact" (18). Surely more needs to be said about this, starting with the idea that 'Judaism' is especially characterized not just as a 'religion' but also as a culture, one with a variety of strains of thought and influence, and continuing with the discussion of scholars such as Wendy Brown and Saba Mahmood on the anti-imperialistic potentialities of religion and, more generally, the deconstuction of the secular/religious dichotomy, a dichotomy which is itself a common locus of imperialist impulses in our time. Levinas's work provides a prime example of the anti-imperialist potentiality of religion since what he identifies and calls 'Hebrew' is itself a decolonizing interruptive impulse, as Drabinski himself so eloquently describes. Moreover, it is too simple to sum up an anti-dance, anti-body impulse as religious or, we might add if the religion under consideration is Levinas's own, as Jewish, since there are strains of Jewish thought that are pro-dance, such as Hasidism, and, more generally, Jewish thought is often understood to be in many respects pro-, not anti-, body. Could Levinas's vacillation between being pro- and anti-body be better understood as the influence of a certain Lithuanian, anti-Hasidic, strain of Jewish thought than the influence of a certain way of conceiving Europe? Certainly his powerfully anticolonialist understanding of ethics as interruptive and prior to the light, associated with what Levinas calls 'Hebrew', can appropriately be seen not as chauvinistic or violent but as an example of religion as a powerful anti-imperialist tool.

I do not myself have answers to all the questions I have raised, and I admire Drabinski's book in many ways, not the least of which is the fact that it goes a good distance in getting us started thinking about such questions. More than that, though, the book is an impassioned, detailed and successful effort to bring Levinasian and postcolonial thinking about otherness together and to show the need that each has for the other. The book's descriptions of weaknesses in Levinas's thought are less finished and less successful, though, or so it seems to me, due to a lack of synthesis of the various criticisms into one overarching critique, as well as to a lack of sensitivity to Levinas's own particular subject position and the accompanying overuse of the idea that Levinas's commitments are European. Overall, the book is well worth reading, especially for anyone who wishes to reflect on how to put together more abstract and more concrete types of ethics of the other or, more generally, on the role of ethical thinking in today's globalized, neocolonial world.