Levinas and Theology

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Michael Purcell, Levinas and Theology, Cambridge University Press, 2006, 208pp., $27.99 (pbk), ISBN 0521012805.

Reviewed by Adriaan Peperzak, Loyola University Chicago


I agreed to review this book because its title promises an elucidation of certain connections between Levinas's work and theology, a promise that few studies on Levinas make and many studies passionately avoid.

The theology to which the author refers is a certain form of Roman-Catholic theology, which he illustrates by referring to Augustine (p. 113), Aquinas (pp. 113-14), Joseph Maréchal (pp. 114-16), Henri de Lubac (pp. 118-122), Karl Rahner (pp. 16-17, 114, 117-22), Jean-Luc Marion (pp. 18, 31-32, 109, 147-48, 170-71), and Jean-Louis Chrétien (pp. 32, 144, 146, 157).

Two quotes introduce the book: (1) one from Psalm 92, which states that the just will flourish like the palm-tree and (2) the famous "Tout est grace" of Thérèse Martin ("de Lisieux"), which the author attributes to George Bernanos. A reader would perhaps guess that the first quote is meant to evoke Levinas's theology, whereas the second summarizes, by way of contrast, the standard Catholic theology, but the rest of the book seems to defend (a) that, notwithstanding Levinas's mistrust of theology (p. 155), "following Levinas, ethics is both first philosophy and first theology" (p. 156), and (b) that Levinas's philosophy (or "ethics") can be interpreted as an introduction to a theology of grace. I must confess that it has not become clear to me how exactly the author wants to defend these theses. Purcell mentions, as the main reason for Levinas's mistrust of theology, that "theology compromises the transcendence of the divine by seeking to make it accessible to thought" or because it "tends towards the theoretical" (p. 155, see also pp. 106, 112, 122 and 164). The question of how this reason coheres with the fact that Levinas, in such major texts as Otherwise Than Being and "Of God who comes to the Idea," has tried to show a philosophical way of access to God is neither asked nor answered in this book.

As for the second thesis, several titles and subtitles (e.g., those of chapter four, "Existence as transcendence, or the call of the infinite towards a theology of grace", and of chapter five, "The economy and language of grace: grace, desire, and the awakening of the subject"; and also the subtitles on pp. 112 and 125) suggest that Levinas's thought is or is close to a theology of grace. On p. 50, however, Purcell declares that "Levinas is not doing theology, but intends a new humanism" and on p. 158, that he

is not a theologian, nor does he claim that what he attempts is theology. […] Yet, ethics is both first philosophy and first theology. As such, what Levinas argues becomes a propaedeutic for theology […].

But I have not been able to find an explicit and clear discussion of the relations between Levinas's philosophy and Purcell's own conception of a theology of grace.

One of the passages that I have tried to understand as an answer to an obvious question that most readers will ask is:

A few problems arise in translating a theology of grace into a Levinas-inspired way of thinking. But these are only seemingly problematical, or quasi-problematical. Two approaches to a theology of graced existence seem possible. The first relates to the phenomenology and theology of desire which tends to be excessive. The second can be articulated in terms of the phenomenology of awakening, whereby the glory of God is not only the human person fully alive (Gloria dei homo vivens), but also the human person fully awake (Gloria dei homo vigilans). (p. 112)

The author seems here to suggest (1) that Levinas himself, while not really offering a theology of grace, can inspire someone who is interested in developing such a theology, and (2) that the problems involved in such a development are not really problematic because two key topics of Levinas's philosophy, desire and awakening, already point in the direction of grace. What, according to Purcell, is opened up by desire and awakening is a "graced existence," which can be identified with "the glory of God," to which Irenaeus refers as the ultimate meaning of human life.

To explain these claims, the author first summarizes some thoughts on desire for God (or the Infinite), found in Augustine (p. 113), Aquinas (pp. 113-14), Maréchal (pp. 114-16), Rahner (pp. 117-19), De Lubac (pp. 117-22), and Levinas (pp. 122-25), after which he presents Levinas's "awakening" as an "awakening to grace" (pp. 125-34). The juxtaposition of these summaries does not lead to a systematic comparison between or explicit discussion of the invoked Christian authors and Levinas's "theology"(?) or "ethics." This makes it difficult to understand to what extent the author thinks that Levinas's philosophy contains (implicitly? indirectly? laterally?) a theology of grace (despite the fact that Levinas hardly ever thematizes "grace" in the sense of some form of God's presence, assistance, company, compassion, pardon, or salvation). The fact that many Christian theologians -- in their retrieval of Plato's (or perhaps even Socrates') affirmations about the Good -- have seen transcendence to the Infinite, the Good, or God as constitutive for all human beings, and that Levinas shows how the Other's face reveals this transcendence, does not yet open the dimension of grace as it, with variations, has been understood during the entire history of Christian theology. To discover that a human being is moved by a radical desire of the Absolute (or Infinite) is certainly a radical awakening that distinguishes a profound philosophy from superficial talks about desires and inclinations, but it does not reach the Christian understanding of the "living in grace" that is made possible by God's compassion and human resurrection from spiritual death. Purcell states that Levinas contrasts his "ethics" with "a pagan existence," which Purcell characterizes as "a self-enclosed subjectivity" without ethical transcendence (p. 99, cf. pp. 122, 126-27); but Levinas never states that grace is a necessary condition for the transition of an egoistic to an ethically responsible mode of existence, whereas Purcell seems to think that Levinas's use of the word "transcendence" already points to a theology of grace, when he writes that Levinas "is opposing an understanding which, essentially Pelagian, stresses the effort of the individual in both willing and enacting the good and attaining salvation" (p. 113. Cf. also p. 122: "the relationship with the other person is a relationship which I, by my own Pelagian efforts, cannot achieve," p. 124).

If Purcell's book does not really elucidate the theological implications or direct consequences of Levinas's work, we can still ask what it contributes to the steadily growing, but often repetitive secondary literature on Levinas. In the first four chapters (pp. 1-109), the author introduces his readers to the latter's thought by focusing on method (ch. 1), ethics and the question of God (ch. 2), incarnation (ch. 3), and transcendence (ch. 4). For his interpretations of Levinas, he often refers to other secondary literature, for example, to studies of Burggraeve (pp. 35-36, 53-54), Cohen (36-37, 173-74), Balentine (pp. 65-68), Blanchot (140-45, 150), Derrida (144-50), Gibbs (47-49), Janicaud (28-31), Kosky (47-49, 55-59), Marion (8-9, 18, 27-28), and Wright (49-51, 59). Sometimes Levinas himself disappears behind other commentators, whose thoughts often replace Levinas's work. This, for instance, is the case in the first chapter, where the author explains what phenomenology is by summarizing an article of Marion (pp. 8-9) and Levinas's dissertation on Husserl's theory of intuition, published in 1930 (pp. 10-23), after which he introduces two theologians "who adopt a phenomenological attitude" (p. 24), and with whom Levinas has had no contact at all: Lonergan (pp. 24-26) and Karl Rahner (pp. 26-27). The chapter then continues with reflections about relations between phenomenology and theology, in which Marion, Derrida, Janicaud, Chrétien, and Cohen are called to witness (pp. 27-37), leading up to Purcell's conclusion: "And thus, ethics is, as Levinas says, 'first theology'" (p. 37, see also pp. 33 and 106). Where Levinas says this is not revealed until p. 45, when Purcell refers to "a 1992 interview entitled The Awakening of the I" in which Levinas says about holiness that it is "an original ethical event which would also be first theology." But, first, it is not immediately clear whether the English translation used here is correct. The French phrase that ends with the words "serait aussi théologie première," could well mean that "under certain conditions" (e.g., if we understand the word "theology" in a certain, for instance philosophical, sense) or "according to some," this original ethical event is first theology. But even if the translation as quoted were correct, the context would have to be analyzed carefully before we could state that Levinas here indeed speaks about theology in the Catholic sense of this word that Purcell hears in it. Second, interviews are not the safest bases for far-reaching theses regarding Levinas's thought, if their affirmations are not supported by the texts he himself has written, checked, and finalized for publication. Besides a few interviews which we know Levinas had explicitly authorized, there are many others that we should handle very cautiously. In any case, it seems to me rather adventurous to take a single phrase, whose conditional form is far from clear, out of context in order to transform it into a basic principle of Levinas's philosophy.

What is most surprising in Purcell's overview of a great variety of phenomenologies is (1) that Heidegger, to whom Levinas always has referred as the greatest master, is not even mentioned, and (2) that practically nothing is said about the practice of the phenomenological approach and the explicit -- partly positive, partly critical -- remarks about it that are found in Levinas's mature and late work.

There are many more passages with which I would like to take issue, but I will mention only a few of the ones that seem to me misleading or wrong. On p. 58, in the middle of his summary of Kosky's interpretation of Levinas's thought as a philosophy of religion (pp. 55-59), Purcell writes: "Hence, the subtitle of Totality and Infinity: 'a defence of interiority on the basis of exteriority.'" Has he not read the real subtitle "Essai sur l'extériorité"? And how does he reconcile this "defense of interiority" with Levinas's critical eighty-page Section II of Totality and the Infinite on "Interiority and Economy," which Purcell reduces to two pages (pp. 86-88)?

On pp. 102-103, the author tries to explain Levinas's distinction between the saying and the said with the help of Habermas's (in my opinion rather different) distinction between instrumental reason and communicative praxis. On p. 104, he places Levinas's contrast between Abraham and Ulysses under the subtitle "The call of the infinite" and draws a parallel between Levinas's "own consideration of cultural meaning and value" with "the non-transcendence instrumentalized reason and its expression."

Another amalgam is found on p. 108: "What the [scil. Levinas's] idea of the infinite introduces is the notion of an excessive or saturated phenomenon." I strongly doubt whether Levinas would accept Marion's "saturated phenomenon" as a name for the infinity of the face or God, of which Levinas even says that they are not phenomena at all.

A similar mixture is found in the pages that are dedicated to "the logic of giving" (p. 143), which Purcell places under the title "eucharistic existence." What Levinas thinks about "liturgy" (a term Levinas sometimes has used to indicate being-for-the-Other) is explained by references to Blanchot (pp. 142-43, 150, 166-67), Derrida (pp. 144-50), Jean-Louis Chrétien (pp. 144-46, 157), Aquinas (p. 157), and Paul (p. 157).

One mistake must certainly be indicated: the author's interpretation of Levinas's "illeity" as "illeity of the other [human] person" (pp. 95, 130-34, 146) and its confusion with "the third" (le tiers, p. 132). On p. 133 the author himself quotes a passage where Levinas explains that "the Absolute […] is neither being nor non-being, […] the 'excluded third' of the beyond of being and non-being, a third person which we have called 'illeity' and which perhaps also the word God says" (L'au-dela du verset, p. 157). Levinas has here added a note to the expression "illeity" that refers the reader to his essay "Enigma and Phenomenon" in Discovering Existence with Husserl and Heidegger. Whoever reads this essay or the passages on "illeity" of Otherwise than Being cannot doubt that Levinas has reserved this word for evoking God, who does not show but instead leaves the Other and the third in the trace of his immemorial "past." Perhaps Purcell has been mislead by the expressions "excluded third" (tiers exclu), but it is obvious that this cannot be a name for "the third" who, on the contrary, embraces all others associated with the Other who here and now looks at me and thus relates me to "the Absolute."

The main general purpose of the author seems to lie in his emphasis on the worldly, "incarnate," and concrete character of Levinas's "ethics," which Purcell sees as the core of Levinas's new humanism (pp. 50-55) from which he expects that it can renew Catholic theology. I doubt, however, whether his explanations are sufficiently clear and his argumentation strong enough to convince many readers that Levinas's "ethics," as he understands it, is the royal way to a theology of religious transcendence and grace.