Levinas et l'exception du soi

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Rodolphe Calin, Levinas et l'exception du soi, Presses Universitaires de France, 2005, 388pp., €36.00 (pbk), ISBN 2130543774.

Reviewed by Diane Perpich, Clemson University


Ontology and ethics are standardly portrayed as opposing or mutually exclusive terms within the Levinasian corpus: there is Being (ontology) and the Good beyond being (ethics). By contrast, the premise of Rodolphe Calin's book is that ethics and ontology are "two figures" of an overarching Levinasian "egology" (9). Calin reads Levinas's work, from early to late, as an attempt to "describe subjectivity for itself and from itself" (7) -- a task he also sees as central to the works of Kierkegaard and Michel Henry. But if, for Henry in particular, the self is assured of itself or purely and immanently present to itself, the Levinasian self is infinitely more fragile and tenuous. Calin describes the latter as constituted by a double movement in which it first tears itself free of the anonymity of being in order to posit itself as a self and then tears itself free again of its own egoism in order to be for an other in an ethical relationship. In neither instance is the self guaranteed its place; indeed, it is only in ceding its place or in denying itself without fully losing itself that the Levinasian self accomplishes itself. This double movement, which Calin also describes as two processes of subjectivation or two ways of being a self (11), best captures in his view the trajectory of Levinas's philosophical thought.

Levinas et l'exception du soi is divided into two main parts. The five chapters of Part I, entitled "Solitude et Abandon," present a densely textured and nuanced reading of Levinas's early work, especially Existing and Existents. The focus here is on the movement by which the self tears itself up from the anonymity of being in order to posit itself as a self. Calin spends most of the first chapter setting up a paradox that is central to his reading of Levinas's ontology. The Levinasian self is accomplished, Calin convincingly shows, not by means of a self-affirmation but by a self-refusal: "to be a self is to be turned away from oneself" (37). But in fact, the situation of the self is even more complicated as the analysis goes on to show. On the one side, Levinas affirms the priority of the existent, or self, over the anonymous existing of the 'there is' [il y a] -- an existing without existents -- but at the same time, there is a violent contestation of the self's right to just such a mastery over being (38). This tension gives rise to "the paradox of a philosophy of the subject that begins with the experience of the destruction of the subject, that is to say, which begins with an experience [of the il y a] that ruins the possibility of every experience, of all phenomality, because it describes the destruction of the self [moi] who could have this experience" (42). Calin sees in this paradox the expression or realization of a "phenomenology à la limite" -- a phenomenology pressed up against and exceeding its own limits, but also a phenomenology of the limit or of liminal phenomenona, an "emphatic phenomenology" (43). It is through this latter notion that Calin ultimately positions Levinas vis-à-vis Husserl, Heidegger, and the phenomenological reduction. Rather than engaging in a reduction which issues in a transcendental ego or a Dasein authentically faced with its own mortality, the Levinasian reduction to an existing without existents is a "reduction of the phenomenological reduction" and is meant to show, in the final analysis, that "the relation with existence is not synonymous with a relation to the world" (45).

The remainder of the analysis in Part I proceeds by way of a set of comparisons that put Levinas's ontology in conversation with Jean-Luc Nancy (on being abandoned in being or on the impossibility, for Levinas, of ever fully abandoning oneself), with Sartre (on nothingness and anonymity), with Henry (on suffering and dis-individuation, as well as on affectivity), and with Kierkegaard (on despair). Of special interest here is the extensive comparison with Henry whose work is still somewhat neglected outside of France and whose immanentist ontology Calin uses quite deftly as a foil for Levinas's different conceptualization of subjectivity and its relation to immanence and transcendence. The figures that Calin invokes in his discussion -- those of abandon, solitude, suffering, fatigue, and despair -- clearly evoke the subjectivity of Levinas's early works: a subjectivity encumbered by its own being and for whom the relationship to the world provides a certain distance from itself, but no possibility of escape or transcendence.

Part II, entitled "Patience et Inspiration," also contains five chapters as well as a conclusion. The primary interest here is the second side of the double movement of subjectivity wherein the self uproots itself from being to be for another. In short, the first part of the book treats Levinas's ontology from the perspective of an egology or study of the subject whereas the second half treats his ethics in like manner. Calin's reading in Part II draws principally from Otherwise Than Being or Beyond Essence, and the focus is on those figures of Levinas's later thought that mirror the earlier figures in evoking a certain passivity or encumberment, with the difference that now the self is weighed down by ethical responsibility rather than by its own being. Speaking of Levinas's emphatic method -- the generation of new meanings through a hyperbolic extension of familiar terms, e.g., a passivity more passive than passivity -- Calin rightly notes the presence of the method already in the early texts. Indeed, he sees both ontology and ethics, and the passage from one to the other, as each involving a kind of emphasis or as being "two degrees of excess" (251). Being is emphatic or excessive, as Levinas portrays it, in that it is a suffocating presence from which the self struggles to liberate itself. This liberation, however, can take place only through another form of emphasis or excess, namely, "the ethical emphasis which leads beyond the positivity of being toward an otherwise than being …" (251). 'Patience', 'election', and 'inspiration' -- all of which are figured emphatically in Levinas's later works -- become the core of Calin's analysis of the ethical relation and are unpacked through comparison with their tellingly different treatment in the works of Maurice Blanchot and Paul Ricoeur. In the final chapter of this section, Calin moves beyond ontology and ethics to consider questions of a politics based in the idea of an "inspired community."

While the comparisons of Levinas's thought with a host of contemporary French philosophers is certainly a strength of Calin's book and should make it of interest to those wishing to see Levinas's thought in wider perspective, the greatest innovation in Calin's work may well come less from what it does than from what it does not do or, more precisely, from what it does not read. Calin makes but very few references to Totality and Infinity and the narrative of the 1961 text, which largely dominated the reception of Levinas's thought in the English speaking world, is conspicuous mainly in its absence. In the wake of Derrida's essay "Violence and Metaphysics," the first wave of Levinas scholarship in the United States and Britain concerned itself principally with the conceptual coherence of the notion of absolute alterity or radical difference and with the problems and prospects of an ethics driven by Totality and Infinity's descriptions of 'the face of the other'. In many respects, Levinas's middle work was the lens through which his œuvre as a whole was read: early works like Existence and Existents and Time and the Other were of interest primarily as the pathway through which the reader could trace the emergence of the notion of absolute alterity; later works were read as a response to intractable problems in the Totality and Infinity account of the face. Focusing almost exclusively on Existence and Existents and Otherwise Than Being allows Calin to make evident the structural parallels linking Levinas's early and late conceptions of subjectivity. It is also by this means that Calin is able to argue that the dominant concern of Levinas's œuvre from beginning to end has been with questions of the self and subjectivity; indeed, at one point very late in the book Calin goes so far as to say that Levinas's concern has been "to promote a phenomenology of the soul" (365).

Calin's approach is intriguing, though it should be noted that it is not entirely novel as there have been other books which have emphasized Levinas's qualified defense of the subject (notably Gérard Bailhache's 1994 Le subject chez Emmanuel Levinas. Fragilité et subjectivité). Moreover, though the approach through subjectivity seems to hold out the promise of a new perspective on Levinas, the reader may be disappointed to find that the Levinas which emerges from this egological reading is little different from the Levinas she already knew. As but one example, we can take up the reading of politics from the end of Calin's book which is typical both for the fineness of the reading and for a certain disappointment in what it ultimately delivers.

As Adriana Cavarero has said, to redefine subjectivity is to redefine politics. What sort of politics, then, arises from the fragile and tenuous subject that is at the heart of Calin's thesis? Calin does not embroil himself in the habitual problems that arise whenever the topic of a Levinasian politics is broached. He does not focus on Levinas's problematic notion of the "third," or the other of the Other, who is said to be the beginning of the kinds of impersonal calculations politics requires. Likewise, he shies away from the usual ways of framing the relation of Levinas's ethics to politics, neither arguing that one can derive a politics from the ethics, nor deconstructing, as does Derrida, the desire for such a derivation. Politics, Calin affirms, is not a matter of saying something else, but of saying the self otherwise than it has already been said. Again stressing the continuity of Levinas's thought over time, Calin suggests that if Levinas portrays the individual first "in the concreteness of egoism, then in the concreteness of the ethical face to face … he also develops the idea of individuation of the self on the basis of the We" (331-32). Community as Levinas envisions it is not a genealogical community, bound by a chronology or by lines of kinship and descent. Levinasian community is essentially an "interpretive community" (333).

Again hewing to his earlier line that Levinas is engaged in a phenomenological project, though a phenomenology à la limite, Calin suggests that a phenomenology of revelation is concretely accomplished in Levinas's thought as a phenomenology of writing. To emphasize écriture, of course, goes against the grain of Derrida's well-known charge that Levinas privileges speech and pure presence over the differance and heteroglossia of writing. Calin does not engage this charge directly, but he makes a compelling case for seeing writing as integral to Levinas's later works. Of more direct concern to him is the question of the sense in which writing, according to Levinas, can be called revelation (335). The answer according to Calin is that the speech which reveals and is revealed cannot do so without being written. The justification for this claim comes in a consideration of the Levinasian notion of the trace. What is distinctive about the trace is that it is not a sign leading to a determined and determinate signified; nor is it the visible proof of something no longer visible (as the thief's fingerprints are the proof of his having been on the scene). As Calin rightly notes, the trace is all ambiguity. It disturbs the phenomenal order of things and causal chains, but in a manner that is never definitive; it disturbs the order of being, Levinas says, but without seriously troubling it (342). As Levinas rather quaintly puts it, the trace is like diplomatic language or like a sexual innuendo: a possibility is put forward, but if one likes, nothing has been said and the whole incident can be explained in different, more ordinary terms. Revelation is likewise ambiguous. Citing Marion, Calin explains that Levinas's thought does not seek the event of revelation, "but tries to describe the possibility of it" (343).

Anticipating the objection that not all speech is writing, Calin insists that it is in the sense that "all speech is written because the one who speaks never remains sufficiently close to his own voice," which is to say that one never fully controls or even fully achieves the intended meaning of one's speech. It is as if, Calin writes, the speaker already "cites the speech of another" (347). It is in this sense that one speaks of the inspiration of the one by the other and this is also the sense, for Calin, of the "inspired community." Calin goes on to emphasize the necessarily fragmented nature of this community. It never speaks with a single voice, indeed a single voice is insufficient to "authenticate divine speech [or revelation]; all voices are necessary, and the whole history across which they are deployed" (353).

Calin's reading moves a bit too easily (as do Levinas's writings) between religious and political discourses and the account may be hard to swallow for those who are unconvinced by the identification or those who find it politically suspect. All the same, the idea of a political community as an interpretive community which possesses no singular truths or meanings and in which what needs to be maintained is the possibility of justice, that is, the possibility of new justifiable meanings, principles, laws, or other social directives, seems right as a portrayal of Levinasian politics -- and indeed is quite close to the view taken in many of Derrida's late political writings (e.g., The Politics of Friendship). But is it sufficient to leave the matter there? As promising as the idea might be, it leaves multiple problems unresolved, indeed unmentioned. First there is the difficult question of who the we of this community is and how it is constituted -- a particularly vexing question in an age which recognizes that all inclusions are simultaneously exclusions and that inclusion is not always voluntary or coerced but just as often a result of disciplinary practices, many of them performed by the self on itself. Moreover, in speaking of a community of the book, Calin like Levinas never considers that the book will be other than the Hebrew Bible. To be sure, Levinas and Calin insist that the Bible is everyone's book, which is to say that both eschew religious particularism in the construction of the interpretive or inspired community. But may not this be a new kind of englobing totality? Is "the book" or bookishness really universal in some way that ensures the justice of the community thereby formed? In effect, this conception of politics seems to be urging a kind of plurality, an openness to the other's voice, even a strong sense that my voice is constituted in a social context by the voice of others. But are all voices mutually intelligible to one another? What of the voices that one community literally cannot hear or finds unintelligible as voices?

"We write ourselves to let ourselves be invented by the other, but also perhaps in order to invent the other" (370). The sentiment is a beautiful one, and potentially a radical one, politically speaking, but the reading remains conservative because it never becomes clear what this would mean in terms of good works or social and political practices. In other words, we're left with pious sentiments but no discussion of the real difficulties of political community -- a fact all the more surprising since Calin elsewhere in the book insists that the concrete is integral to Levinas's conceptions of ethical (and presumably political) life. In being faithful to the letter of Levinas's text, rarely moving very far from Levinas's idiomatic way of speaking and thinking, Calin gives us an accomplished and informed, if not wholly unexpected, portrayal of Levinas's theory of subjectivity.