Levinas' Ethical Politics

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Michael L. Morgan, Levinas' Ethical Politics, Indiana University Press, 2016, 410pp., $40.00 (pbk), ISBN 9780253021106.

Reviewed by Timothy Stock, Salisbury University


In one sense, at least, this book is necessary for those who take Levinas seriously. It is not uncommon to hear that Levinas' ethics contains political flaws, that his politics are either suspect or, when viewed from ethics on his own terms, outright hypocritical. Many people, and perhaps this is increasingly true amongst younger scholars, have taken Judith Butler's critique as definitive in her accusation that, for Levinas, Palestinians have no face, a damning political denunciation of a philosopher whose usage of the face-to-face encounter declares the limitless nature of human responsibility.

A centerpiece of Michael L. Morgan's accomplishment is an account of the specious nature of this accusation. His book provides a thorough reading of Levinas' "most controversial interview" (p. 266-297)[1], as well as responses to objections from Howard Caygill, Simon Critchley, Butler and Gillian Rose (p. 301-351), each of whom depends in some way upon drawing a political position from Levinas' work. Morgan's text reminds us that these objections, while serious, cannot obliterate the monumental philosophical production that Levinas represents, and that there are exceptional resources contained therein to discuss the relationship between ethics and politics. One hopes this will be the first of many reengagements with the diverse political possibilities of Levinas' philosophy.

Morgan argues that Levinas can be the source of a unique conception of ethical politics, in the specific form of "messianic democratic socialism" (p. 188). In this he embraces the notion that Levinas' philosophical fate can be productively linked to the fate of Zionism, and that we may even see in his work reason for optimism and renewal of an ethical legitimation for Israel in the present day. The central thesis that supports Morgan's approach is that Levinas' ethical philosophy can direct us towards a legitimation of the state through its capacity to be just in providing for the disenfranchised and the vulnerable. Ethics can play an extra-political role as an engaged form of critique, but must not abandon civic institutions or politics.

Much of Levinas' contribution to Morgan's text is located in three chapters, each grounded in Levinas' talmudic readings, grouped under the themes of prophesy (p. 151-189), Zionism (p. 190-227), and messianism (p. 228-265). These chapters are preceded by four that develop the relationship between ethics and politics via "the third party" (p. 45-61), the critical politics whereby ethics makes possible (p. 62-89) the political role of responsibility for others (p. 90-124), and finally an account of the specific form of liberal democracy one can establish via these ethical concerns (p. 125-147). Throughout, Morgan puts Levinas in conversation with a very wide range of philosophers and political scientists, though certain figures, such as Avishai Margalit, contribute substantially (from outside the bounds of Levinas' philosophy per se). Equally wide is Morgan's appreciation for Levinas scholarship.

One of the many threads that occupy this book is whether a particular religious ethical tradition, Judaism, would add to or detract from the legitimacy of a state. Gently, but thoroughly, opposed to democratic legitimacy being strictly bound to secularism, Morgan attempts to leverage his understanding of Levinas' ethics as a Jewish ethics to present the possibility that religious ethics could add political legitimacy.

[Levinas'] purpose is to locate and understand the ethical teaching central to Judaism and its role in an understanding of the human condition and social existence generally. The upshot is that for Levinas, what Judaism means and what democracy -- or liberal democracy -- requires converge. For him, it is not surprising that Israel ought to be both Jewish and democratic. In this respect, Israel is no different from any state . . . in that it ought to be attentive to the needs and concerns of all her citizens, ought to treat all fairly and humanely, and ought to seek justice and peace, and hence, speaking metaphorically, the ideal for any state ought to be that it be "Jewish" in the sense that it be as ethical as possible . . . (p. 216-217)

Even with consideration for the breadth of Morgan's reading, passages like this may give the reader pause. The question is simple: if to be "Jewish" simply means to "be as ethical as possible", why call it Jewish, or make Jewishness into a metaphor? Morgan can and would respond to this question by indicating at least the fascinating political layer within Levinas' talmudic readings, in that these Jewish texts and Levinas' understanding of them have something political to say. But then at the very least Morgan owes it to his reader to replace "be as ethical as possible" with "be as ethical as possible, especially in terms of ethics as understood in key talmudic sources." Even with this there ought to be significant consideration as to whether or not Morgan's selection of talmudic readings is definitive, or whether Levinas is even the appropriate guide to Talmud, which itself problematizes who is to hold authority in teaching it.

It is not in any way unwarranted to consider Judaism an ethical religion, nor is it unusual to draw specific political prescriptions from this. Morgan notes that his reading would put Levinas closer to Hermann Cohen, at least insofar as monotheism comes to mean "there is one moral law for one humanity," or, quoting Buber, that people in community ought to "stand in a living, reciprocal relationship to a single living center " (p. 49). These usages are consistent with Levinas to a point, but would jibe with the notion that "faith purged of myths, the monotheist faith, itself implies metaphysical atheism."[2] Can Morgan guarantee that monotheism, when political, has only a moral and not a metaphysical significance? If not, any messianic politics, in failing to "prohibit the metaphysical relation to God from being accomplished in ignorance of men and things,"[3] would stand to violate an important Levinasian test.

Whether Morgan's approach can pass a democratic test is, with respect, more than a matter of simply whether an ethical politics can be religiously informed, or whether concern for the needs of others ought to count as a test of political legitimacy. The point is that even for a religious politics, Levinas would require a certain kind of "atheism", a recognition that God totalized within human affairs is illegitimate, and that the transcendent must originate from particular responsibilities to concrete others.

This concern, Morgan's easy passage between the transcendent, universal or categorical register of Levinasian terms and the empirical, particular and concrete one, recurs again and again. It is even raised by Morgan himself in responding to Martin Kavka's objections to Morgan's understanding of messianism (p. 260-265). Kavka's concern is that Morgan's emphasis on weak messianism misses the possibility of a strong, apocalyptic messianism that breaks from ethical concern for human affairs; that is, messianism could represent a form of politics without ethics. Kavka does not appear to be addressed so much as simply reassured that "Levinas' messianism performs [understanding and acceptance of responsibility] by being both ethical and political, both personal and political, and both individual and collective" (p. 265). Such assurances may not be convincing. And again, if the purpose of this is to insist that all he means by messianism is "care, protection, generosity, love and charity" (p. 263), what then is the function of calling it "messianism" at all?

Even a sympathetic reader can be forgiven some confusion as to what Morgan's politics are really meant to look like. His defense of Levinas against Butler and others of a kin is vigorous and welcome, as is his desire to set the record straight about Levinas' "notorious interview". However, in maintaining, in explicit fidelity to Jean-Luc Marion, that "the other is both an utterly particular second person and at the same time a completely general third person" (p. 353), Morgan means: the face of the other, as well as the third, are always utterly particular and always utterly universal (p. 395n). This could be challenged simply as a reading of Levinas: how am I supposed to give the "bread from my mouth" to the other and the third at the same time?

Following the passage citing Marion, Morgan concludes that Levinas is indeed ultimately a kind of "metaphysical" thinker (p. 354). It will be for his readers to determine whether or not the metaphysical ambiguity he finds between the other and the third is itself a mythology of "the face", which at its worst could represent a form of magical thinking. Hence one can absorb the impressive scope of Morgan's argument while still being convinced that Levinas' thought may be better served by allowing it a very human hypocrisy, rather than trading this humanity for a mythic consistency.

[1] Though the scope of Morgan's treatment of Butler is much broader, it should be noted that his accusation of her "distortion" of Levinas' words is not too strong. See Oona Eisenstadt and Claire Katz, "The Faceless Palestinian: A History of an Error," Telos 174 (Spring 2016) p. 9-32.

[2] Totality and Infinity, p. 77.

[3] Totality and Infinity, p. 78.