Levinas's Existential Analytic: A Commentary on Totality and Infinity

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James R. Mensch, Levinas's Existential Analytic: A Commentary on Totality and Infinity, Northwestern University Press, 2015, 229pp., $27.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780810130548.

Reviewed by Martin Shuster, Avila University


James R. Mensch has produced an excellent book, one that deserves serious consideration and study by generalists, specialists, and/or students who might be somewhere in between. This is especially so because Mensch's book is written in a lucid but critical style. In fact, the excellence of this book made this a difficult review to write, partly because there is so much with which I agree, but more because Mensch's aim is to provide a commentary on Emmanuel Levinas's 1961 magnum opus, Totality and Infinity: An Essay on Exteriority. As he writes, "My aim in presenting a commentary on it is to help students follow its arguments and grasp the subtle phenomenological analyses that fill it" (3). I thereby feel compelled to address Levinas's book even as I address Mensch's. And such is also the structure present in Levinas's Existential Analytic, which, after a brief introduction, follows the substance and order of Levinas's book. So, in what follows, in addition to a critical analysis of Mensch's book, I address its success as a commentary.

There are many ways to understand the significance of Levinas's Totality and Infinity, but it strikes me as fruitful to follow Mensch and to highlight Levinas's background in phenomenology, and especially in the work of Martin Heidegger. A way to present the importance of Mensch's book (and thereby Levinas's book) is to highlight the extent to which Heidegger has had an impressive and now long-standing afterlife in contemporary Anglophone philosophy.[1] The same has not been true of Levinas. Indeed, Levinas is often viewed with suspicion by Anglophone philosophers; it is hard to understand why since it cannot be attributed solely to the difficulty of Levinas's writing (3). (After all, other difficult writing has made its way into Anglophone philosophy -- think notably of the texts of Fichte, Hegel, and Heidegger, not to mention Sellars and Cavell). In this regard, I hope that Mensch's book will rectify this problem since what makes his book so successful is that he is able to succinctly and clearly locate (1) Levinas's project, both historically and analytically, and (2) present a critical engagement with that project all while (3) offering an impressive commentary on the text, one that will be of use to many in the future. Before offering some critical remarks, let me address Mensch's book in more detail.

In his commentary on Being and Time, Hubert Dreyfus stresses that, among other things, "What Martin Heidegger is after in Being and Time is nothing less than deepening our understanding of what it means for something (things, people, abstractions, language, etc.) to be."[2] As Dreyfus emphasizes, Heidegger's allegedly unique contribution is the overturning of prior conceptions of intentionality -- how a mind directs itself towards objects -- from an epistemological or representationalist model to a practical one.[3] A similar reading of Heidegger, without reference to Dreyfus, is one that Mensch prioritizes (7, 12, 64, 75ff). Mensch does this in order to locate his reading of Levinas as someone similarly engaged in reconceiving intentionality, but as someone for whom Heidegger's own project is (1) not radical enough and (2) ethically dubious.

Beginning with the first point, note that for Heidegger, we are always already 'being-in-the-world,' that is we  are oriented around and immersed in a familiarity and practical engagement with a world, and that any other stances we might take (say that of locating elements of the world as 'subject' and 'object') are in fact derivative on that prior "absorbed coping" (in Dreyfus's words). For Heidegger, this means that human existence is best understood as oriented around 'care,' which is a term of art that for Heidegger unifies the various formal and structural elements that make up 'being-in-the-world' (say, the fact that we have a world, a past, a present, and future, and so forth),[4] and that above all, 'being-in-the-world' is not some sort of positional or spatial category but rather a phenomenological one that makes spatial and positional categories themselves possible. One way to understand elements of Levinas's claims is to see him suggesting that Heidegger has failed to acknowledge certain phenomenological elements and categories as essential, notably the structure of the 'home' or 'dwelling' (which is a prerequisite for any 'being-in-the-world'), and the priority of 'enjoyment' or 'living from' to the very structure of 'care' (95f and 84ff, respectively). I find this strand, about the alleged radicalness or lack thereof in Heidegger and Levinas on these points, insufficiently nuanced in Mensch's book. For example, arguing on Levinas's behalf, Mensch casts Heidegger as a utilitarian (64, 75, 105, 146), despite Heidegger's own well-known mockery and rejection of such a position.[5] Similarly, the discussion of 'home' and 'dwelling' in fact requires a deeper engagement between Levinas and Heidegger since both saw the value of this category but disagreed about the most fundamental ethical and political commitments.[6]

This point about ethics returns us to the second point: that Levinas has ethical objections to Heidegger's project. One way to understand what orients the issues here is to recognize that for Levinas there is allegedly something prior "to that asserted by Heidegger's existential analytic of Dasein as care" (90). (And I mention this in order to raise, again, the potential importance of Levinas to the contemporary reception of Heidegger within Anglophone philosophy). One way to understand Levinas's approach is to note that like Heidegger, "as a phenomenologist, he is interested in the disclosure of entities and thus in the entity -- Dasein -- that engages in this disclosure" (176). In other words, Levinas was, like Heidegger, Dreyfus, Brandom, Haugeland, and many others, interested in intentionality and human consciousness. Unlike them, however, he mines and presents the phenomenological importance of the fact that the most fundamental basis for all intentionality and human consciousness is a sensuous engagement with an other. Levinas's term of art for this is the 'face-to-face,' as when he points out that the "face-to-face is not a modality of coexistence . . . but is the primordial production of being on which all the possible collocations of the terms are founded" (quoted on 178).

Making clear the importance of the other for understanding intentionality and human consciousness (not to mention objectivity and truth, see 65-67 and 45-53, 188-191, respectively) naturally presents the importance of language and discourse, a theme that unites Levinas, albeit not exclusively, with significant segments of Anglophone philosophy.[7] Mensch effectively captures everything that is at stake with this point when he writes that:

For Levinas, by contrast, self-separation and hence, freedom occur through the Other. They arise when I respond to the Other's alternative perspective. The distinction of my will from inclination or appetite occurs when I have to explain myself to the Other, that is, present him with my reasons for what I say and do. As for reason, its origin is precisely this need of explaining oneself. The question of reason, the question "Why?" originates in the encounter with the Other's alternative perspective (130).

Given Mensch's own discussion (27ff), the word 'need' would better be replaced by Levinas's technical term, 'desire,' the idea that all language, indeed, any phenomenology of human or subjective life presupposes a prior acknowledgment of the absolute separation and uniqueness of the other, i.e., of the fact of human plurality, of the fact of there being more than just an I, but always already a you (177). In this way, one can grasp the radical nature of Levinas's phenomenological analysis: in Totality and Infinity he presents us with a phenomenology of this fact, of the fact that the Other, no matter what I think of her, perpetually has the ability to contest, overflow, and/or entirely bewilder whatever categories I might apply to her.

Later, in "Language and Proximity" (1967), Levinas will stress that language can thereby be understood as modeled on touch, on contiguity, proximity. He writes there that, "language is the possibility of entering into relationship independently of every system of signs common to the interlocutors. Like a battering-ram, it is the 'power' to break through the limits of culture, body, and race."[8] Levinas's entire account is oriented around the fact that human subjectivity -- my existence as an agent -- is in fact dependent on a prior relation with the Other. That relation, in turn, is not to be understood as a cognitive or linguistic or practical affair but rather as itself making possible my having a world -- being or beings -- in the first place (187-188).

In this way, exactly because Levinas's project is important ethically and phenomenologically -- if not epistemologically -- this commentary is timely and will be of value to a wide array of scholars working through Levinas's magnum opus. It will certainly make the labor of working through Levinas's book that much easier, and where it might not register all of the nuanced academic debates,[9] such choices are more than justified by the striking lucidity Mensch achieves and by the courage of constructing such a commentary in the first place. Ultimately, there is much here that will greatly expand access to Levinas and even more that will spur new work. Therefore, if the book, as the back cover suggests, is modeled on Norman Kemp Smith's commentary on Kant's Critique of Pure Reason, Mensch's Levinas's Existential Analytic is a potent and remarkable success. It should open Levinas to future readers, who might begin to suspect, as I do (and as I suspect Mensch does too), that Levinas's philosophical achievements are as important for us to study as Kant's own.


Thanks to Bettina Bergo and Tarek Dika for comments on an earlier version of this review; of course, any mistakes are my own.


Brandom, Robert. "Heidegger's Categories in "Being and Time"." The Monist 66, no. 3 (1983): 387-409.

Dreyfus, Hubert. Being-in-the-World: A Commentary on Heidegger's Being and Time, Division I. The MIT Press, 1991.

Gauthier, David. Martin Heidegger, Emmanuel Levinas, and the Politics of Dwelling. Lexington Books, 2011.

Haugeland, John. "Heidegger on Being a Person." Noûs 16 (1982): 15-26.

Heidegger, Martin. Being and Time. Translated by Joan Stambaugh.: SUNY Presss, 1996.

-- -- -- . The Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics: World, Finitude, Solitude. Translated by William McNeill and Nicholas Walker. Indiana University Press, 2001.

Levinas, Emmanuel. "Language and Proximity." Translated by Alphonso Lingis. In Collected Philosophical Papers, 109-27. Martinus Nijhoff Publishers, 1987.

Moran, Dermot. "Heidegger's Critique of Husserl's and Brentano's Accounts of Intentionality." Inquiry 43, no. 1 (2000): 39-65.

Perpich, Diane. The Ethics of Emmanuel Levinas. Stanford University Press, 2008.

Shuster, Martin. "On the Ethical Basis of Language: Some Themes in Davidson, Cavell, and Levinas." Journal for Cultural and Religious Theory 14, no. 2 (2015): 241-66.

[1] What follows is by no means near exhaustive, but note, for example, that Robert Brandom's and John Haugeland's essays on Heidegger from the early 1980s are now almost 35 years old. See Robert Brandom, "Heidegger's Categories in Being and Time," The Monist 66, no. 3 (1983); John Haugeland, "Heidegger on Being a Person," Noûs 16 (1982).

[2] Hubert Dreyfus, Being-in-the-World: A Commentary on Heidegger's Being and Time, Division I (Cambridge: The MIT Press, 1991), 1.

[3] For a justification of my use of 'alleged' here, see Dermot Moran, "Heidegger's Critique of Husserl's and Brentano's Accounts of Intentionality," Inquiry 43, no. 1 (2000).

[4] See Martin Heidegger, Being and Time, trans. Joan Stambaugh (Albany: State University of New York, 1996), §79.

[5] See Martin Heidegger, The Fundamental Concepts of Metaphysics: World, Finitude, Solitude, trans. William McNeill and Nicholas Walker (Bloomington: Indiana University Press, 2001), 177.

[6] On this point, see David Gauthier, Martin Heidegger, Emmanuel Levinas, and the Politics of Dwelling (Baltimore: Lexington Books, 2011).

[7] See Martin Shuster, "On the Ethical Basis of Language: Some Themes in Davidson, Cavell, and Levinas," Journal for Cultural and Religious Theory 14, no. 2 (2015).

[8] Emmanuel Levinas, "Language and Proximity," in Collected Philosophical Papers (Dordrecht: Martinus Nijhoff Publishers, 1987).

[9] For example, Mensch deals ably with Levinas on ethics (see 25ff), but he nonetheless ignores some important work, notably Diane Perpich, The Ethics of Emmanuel Levinas (Stanford: Stanford University Press, 2008).