Levinas's Philosophy of Time: Gift, Responsibility, Diachrony, Hope

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Eric Severson, Levinas's Philosophy of Time: Gift, Responsibility, Diachrony, Hope, Duquesne University Press, 2013, 372pp., $32.00, ISBN 9780820704623.

Reviewed by Tom Sparrow, Slippery Rock University


Eric Severson's Levinas's Philosophy of Time is notable simply because it is the first monograph exclusively devoted to Levinas's philosophy of time. When approaching a book like this a typical reader expects a few things: (1) a clear, comprehensive, and engaging presentation of its theme; (2) the pursuit of a fascinating and original line of inquiry, not simply a rehearsal of Levinas's own views or an uncritical exegesis of his arguments; (3) a presentation of Levinas's challenging language into something more digestible for readers not steeped in Levinas scholarship. Severson admirably satisfies the first expectation and, with only marginal missteps, the second and third. Not only has he written a learned and readable work of scholarship, he has produced a key to interpreting Levinas's entire body of work, from his earliest essays to his last. This key -- Levinas's understanding of time -- unlocks Levinas's famously "radical claim that ethics is first philosophy" (1). His book is definitely written for scholars of continental philosophy, but it could gain a readership beyond this select group.

The book proceeds chronologically, with each chapter focusing on a set of essays or major work that develops Levinas's philosophy of time. Chapter 1 tracks Levinas's philosophical influences, notably Bergson, Husserl, and Heidegger. Levinas's primary interest in these thinkers is what he calls their "deformalization of time," which is to say, their attempts to uncover a "richer and more primitive sense" of time than the "clock time" described by physics and philosophy since Aristotle (10). Even though in his later work Levinas meticulously avoids naming him when writing alongside Heidegger, and levels deep criticism when he does speak his name, Severson shows the need of the early Levinas to work through Heidegger's philosophy of time, and Heidegger is a major antagonist in his account. It may very well be the case, Severson speculates, that Levinas sees himself as fulfilling -- against Parmenides, Plato, Aristotle, Descartes, Hegel, and even Bergson and Husserl -- Heidegger's aim of properly understanding time (18). This gains plausibility as the book unfolds.

More fascinating than the account of Levinas's influences and impetus, however, is the way that Severson highlights the link between Levinas's reflections on time and the politics and violence of Nazism. In the 1934 essay "Some Thoughts on the Philosophy of Hitlerism," Levinas exposes a "deep distortion of the concepts of time, history, and temporality" in Hitler's ideology, and in the process shows how this distortion betrays a "moral vulnerability" at the heart of modern liberalism (19). This vulnerability is the lack of a grounding principle for responsibility, precisely what Levinas tries to provide in his lifelong investigation of time. If, against pre-modern belief systems, the Enlightenment gave rise to a widespread skeptical need for scientific evidence to adjudicate competing claims to truth and knowledge, then only the security of rationality can provide universal truths. The historicization of rationality, however -- the consequence of discarding faith in absolute, transcendent truth -- can be exploited by force and violence. This is how something arbitrary like Nazi racism can come to seem like a universal truth (23). "Levinas's thesis about Hitlerism is modest and reflective, but the concern is clear: philosophy's modern thoughts about time and history have left the real world of persons and bodies vulnerable to terrible violence" (25). Severson's book is at its best when it's exploring the connection between time and some other theme, whether Hitlerism, capitalism, hope, or language.

Chapter 2 primarily investigates Levinas's 1947 text Existence and Existents, but it also takes on a couple essays from 1948, including "Reality and Its Shadow." Two important moves are made in the former text. The first is a notable break with Heidegger's understanding of time as ecstasis, developed in Being and Time, which Levinas sees as too ego-centered and future-oriented to be an accurate account of time as such. Severson returns again and again to Levinas's insistence that time must be thought apart from the subject, as "fundamentally alterior to the self" (78). Severson names this gesture the "break with Parmenides" and the Western philosophical tradition. The second move is an articulation of "the instant," which forms the center of Levinas's early philosophy of time (49). The instant is pursued against the backdrop of some concepts that seem more literary than philosophical: the night, insomnia, and what Levinas names the il y a (translated as "there is").

The philosophy of the instant is a theme taken up principally from Bergson, who, more than any other, disentangled time from space for continental philosophy (55). Severson rightly shows that Levinas provides a more careful reading of Bergson than Heidegger does (55), but also indicates how Levinas's account of the instant enables him to move past both the Bergsonian and the phenomenological accounts of time, which bind time (especially in the case of phenomenology) to intentionality and freedom. Levinas's philosophy of the instant undoes this tendency, and it is to Severson's credit that he deftly demonstrates how insomnia and the night elucidate this philosophy.

If the instant is often understood as a liberating hiatus from the flux of time, only achievable internally by the self-present subject, then Levinas is original in claiming that the instant is more akin to captivity and powerlessness (50). The instant is a timeless present, without motion and without hope for the future; this point is disclosed readily in the experience of insomnia. For Levinas, this entails a distinct privation of time, a riveting to immanence. It is the very lack of transcendence (61). Given this reading of the instant, Severson shows, through a compelling interpretation of the unusual ideas that fill Existence and Existents, how Levinas positions himself to argue later for an "eschatological redemption of the instant" (61), which casts time as "a gift from the other" (63). Only the other, Levinas will argue, can deliver the insomniac from the terror of the night and set time in motion again. Hope, at this point, becomes the foundation of Levinas's philosophy of time.

In Chapter 3 Severson turns to another text from 1947, the lecture series Time and the Other. Here he aims to show the evolution from the "darkness" of Existence and Existents, which largely focused on themes that could be called ontological, toward Levinas's nascent obsession with alterity and the role that time plays in the ethical relation. "In the Time and the Other lectures, Levinas turns his attention with specificity to that which we need in the powerlessness of our present: the other person" (77). The most helpful part of Severson's exposition here, which ranges from Heidegger's understanding of intersubjectivity as a synchronous Miteinandersein (being-with-others) (85-6) to Levinas's break with the phenomenology of time, is his discussion of the influence that Franz Rosenzweig had on Levinas in this period. Rosenzweig allows Levinas to advance the Jewish eschatological dimension of his account of time, and he is indispensable for understanding the subsequent developments of Levinas's philosophy, particularly as it grows increasingly distant from Heidegger and phenomenology (89, 99). Severson further discusses Rosenzweig in Chapter 6 (204-6).

Chapter 4 is devoted to Levinas's essays of the 1950s, a decade in which his philosophy of time all but ceases to develop. His critique of (especially Heideggerian) ontology and representation, however, intensifies in this period. Severson does well to characterize this critique without resorting to the technical and hackneyed language often employed to criticize "substance ontology." Severson also pauses in his exposition to ask if Levinas has Heidegger right (113-17), which is something that I would have liked to see more of. On many occasions I found myself asking, "Does Levinas have X right here?" Too often Severson's exposition proceeds without asking if Levinas's sometimes hasty or sweeping criticisms of other thinkers are accurate. Stopping to ask these questions would no doubt extend the already substantial expository portion of the book, so it is understandable that Severson rarely does so. Moreover, he does return in the final chapter to flag for future research several of the threads of criticism that he passes over in silence.

Chapter 4 also examines Levinas's use of spatial, rather than temporal, metaphors to describe alterity. Severson began to contrast Levinas's use of spatial and temporal metaphors in the previous chapter, where he signaled Levinas's suspicion of "the shakiness of spatial imagery" (105). Curiously, Levinas continues beyond the 1950s to use spatial metaphors to characterize some of his most important concepts -- e.g., transcendence, the face, separation, exteriority -- and this usage does not disappear even in the early sections of Totality and Infinity. It is not obvious that spatial metaphors are "shaky" or problematic for Levinas's project, but Severson seems to take it as given that they are. Perhaps because they are static, whereas temporal metaphors are dynamic? It certainly has something to do with how space renders self and other co-present, thereby de-prioritizing the time of the other. But must we see space as the locus of presence? At any rate, more discussion of the binary opposition spatial/temporal is required to establish the problematic "consequences to this drift into language of spatiality, interiority, and exteriority" (140), especially since Levinas never really gives up his usage of spatial language, despite his reservations about it. The line between metaphor and existential reality is a vague one in Levinas's texts, and commentators, Severson points out, rarely investigate it closely (105). This is unfortunate because this line does seem crucial to discerning Levinas's meaning, as Severson suggests.

There are a number of points where Severson seems to conflate the temporal and transcendental senses of "priority," for instance, when he writes: "Levinas uses the language of time to describe the opposition of the face. . . . The freedom of the other precedes the battle and opposes the bloodshed of war" (121; cf. 133, 138). Severson is well aware that when Levinas speaks of the priority of the other, he usually means to indicate that the other is the condition of possibility for my responsibility, freedom, life, etc., so it is not clear why he at times refers to this priority as temporal.

Chapters 5 and 6 focus on Levinas's texts of the 1960s, notably Totality and Infinity (published in 1961). In his exposition of Totality and Infinity, Severson continues to catalogue the metaphors used to describe alterity, noting that while the early sections of Levinas's first magnum opus employs many spatial metaphors (dwelling, habitation, exteriority, etc.) that render these sections problematic -- even "danger[ous]" (145) for Levinas's understanding of alterity -- the later sections of the book shift the language to the temporal register (141, 142). The preface to Totality and Infinity, however, employs an "eschatological tone" that returns toward the end of the book to oppose the "logic of violence that dominates the present" (177) and the synchrony of spatial relations. This is because the preface was written last by Levinas, (141). Noting this fact is important for maintaining the coherence of Severson's story about the evolution of time in Levinas's writings.

This evolution takes a radical turn in Otherwise than Being, the lead up to which is discussed in Chapter 6, which includes a lengthy discussion of Derrida's "Violence and Metaphysics" and its impact on Levinas's later philosophy (212-27). In his later texts, Levinas will make the controversial claim that my responsibility for the other issues from a past that "is prior to any memory," an "utterly bygone past," "an irreversible past" that has never been present (186). This is no doubt a startling way to characterize the ethical imperative, and one that seems impossible to validate. Nevertheless, Levinas insists on locating obligation outside the system of signs that humans use to communicate moral norms and make claims on one another. And, after Totality and Infinity, he does so precisely with the concept of the "diachrony of the other." The case is an extremely difficult one to make because the claim that "ethics . . . precedes all philosophy" (227) is so counterintuitive that is sounds nearly absurd. Severson believes that a focus on Levinas's philosophy of time can render this claim more plausible, and indeed he succeeds in removing the air of implausibility from Levinas's view.

Otherwise than Being (published in 1974) is a dense text. It is arguably Levinas's most abstract, and it is likely his most conceptually demanding. Severson devotes Chapter 7 to an exposition of this text's deepening of the concept of time. The focus is on the diachrony at play in language, speech, dialogue, and narration. He aims to clarify Levinas's bold claim that "ethics is first philosophy" as well as what it means to say that ethical obligation descends upon each one of us from a past that has never been present, from the diachronic time of the other. Can these claims be substantiated? Are they true? These are the questions I had going into the penultimate chapter of Severson's book. Unfortunately, I was left uncompelled. Severson recounts the main arguments of Otherwise than Being, with an ear to the temporal significance of these arguments. But his exposition is truncated in a way that his other chapters are not. Perhaps he moves too quickly through the material, or perhaps it is because he writes a little too closely to Levinas in passages like this:

And here we see that dialogue has a peculiar relationship with being. The word that I speak becomes a said, but as a said it contains an epiphany, a revelation of something that is prior to me. Levinas is driving a wedge of alterity into the very lapse between my words and the I who speaks them. The other is already there, in the diachrony that divides my speech between the saying and the said. The saying resists its synchronization, for it moves from behind and before the said and never becomes fully encapsulated in the said. (256)

Even if Severson retains some of the ambiguity of Levinas's language, it is likely attributable to the abstractness of Levinas's thinking in Otherwise than Being, not to a failure of communication on Severson's part. He remains fixated on his chief theme -- diachrony -- throughout the chapter and provides a more-than-challenging reading of Levinas's account of language and its debt to time. Even if I did not find this account compelling, I came away with a subtler understanding of how diachrony functions in Otherwise than Being.

Severson is more than comfortable reading Levinas. His rendering of his technical language displays a comfort and familiarity with the texts. With the possible exception of his chapter on Otherwise than Being, this translates directly into a rewarding reading experience that does not sacrifice the difficulty of Levinas's thinking. He offers clear summaries of the thinkers Levinas is in dialogue with and ties each of the themes in his subtitle -- gift, responsibility, diachrony, hope -- to the philosophy of time. He includes a number of pleasantly surprising minor inquiries as well. Most significant among his accomplishments, Severson demonstrates the unity of Levinas's thinking about time, alterity, and ethics. He does so without assuming that his readers have mastered Levinas's vocabulary or style of argumentation, and he does so without ceremony or undue adulation. If at times it seems like Severson should engage with Levinas more critically, especially on questions of femininity, maternity, and gender, it is to his credit that he closes Levinas's Philosophy of Time by acknowledging the limits of his chronological study and outlining a program for future work on Levinas and time (270).