Levinas, Storytelling and Anti-Storytelling

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Will Buckingham, Levinas, Storytelling and Anti-Storytelling, Bloomsbury, 2013, 178pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781441124159.

Reviewed by Jeffrey R. Di Leo, University of Houston-Victoria


This is a book about telling philosophical stories -- and is itself a kind of story. The philosophical storytellers discussed though are not the usual suspects at the intersections of philosophy and fiction -- nor is the story told by this book the expected one. Consequently, Will Buckingham's book is, in one respect, a unique contribution to both Lévinas scholarship and philosophical aesthetics. However, in another respect, as I hope to make clear, it is itself a very singular story, namely, one about a young philosopher coming to terms with a pair of books that he finds both intriguing and impenetrable.[1]

For many, the heart of philosophical storytelling is found in works such as Voltaire's Candide, Fyodor Dostoevsky's The Brothers Karamozov, Albert Camus's The Stranger, Jean-Paul Sartre's Nausea, and Jorge Luis Borges's Ficciones. In these works, epistemological, metaphysical, and ethical issues are explored through a very thin layer of narrative, plot, and characterization. One feels something different when reading works like these as opposed to say the fictions one can purchase at the supermarket. Though recognized as stories first by their general readers, their philosophical sophistication quickly casts such a heavy shadow over them that they beg to be regarded as something more than mere stories.

Now, place Franz Rosenzweig's The Star of Redemption, Edmund Husserl's Cartesian Meditations, and Emmanuel Lévinas's Totality and Infinity (TI) in the company of works by Voltaire, Dostoevsky, and Borges and you have a sense of the challenge Buckingham faces in this project. Whereas the former group at least will get some heads bobbing up and down in affirmation to the claim that these are works of philosophical storytelling, the latter list will only be affirmed by those with the most robust sense of what storytelling is and can be. Or, to put it another way, if one grants that Husserl and Lévinas are storytellers, then so too are most of the other philosophers in the continental canon.

In a broad sense, these are the stakes that Buckingham faces. His central claim is that Lévinas's TI is the book from his corpus that "seems to engage most in the telling of stories" (8). Published in 1961, about thirty years after the publication of his doctoral dissertation on the theory of intuition in Husserl's phenomenology, and thirty-five years before his death at the age of 89 in 1995, TI is in many ways the midpoint and centerpiece of Lévinas's long and prolific career. Buckingham does not so much as defend his central claim as assert it; that is, he tells us that TI engages more than other works by Lévinas in storytelling, rather than showing us the relative poverty of storytelling in his other works -- a move though that is probably excusable given Lévinas's prodigious output during over 65 years of publishing. The tedium of culling stories from across his collected works would slow down and expand Buckingham's project considerably. Still, some sort of overview or genealogy of Lévinas coming to storytelling in its most engaged sense in TI over the preceding 30 years through glimpses into, say, his works from the 40s and 50s would have been most welcome. Regrettably, there is nary any discussion of storytelling in his other works.

However, instead of cataloguing or genealogy, Buckingham prefers bookending: if TI is the work where Lévinas engages the most in storytelling, then Autrement qu'être ou au-delà de l'essence (AE) is a work where he does the complete opposite. Namely, it "could be seen as a kind of anti-storytelling," writes Buckingham, "a book that attempts to resist the temptation to tell any tale whatsoever, that does its best to kick over the traces of the storytelling in TI until they are entirely effaced" (8). But the move from the storytelling in TI to anti-storytelling in AE appears in Buckingham's book to be both sudden and unexplained -- as though in one work he found merit in storytelling, whereas in the next it became antithetical to him.

I say "sudden" because there is little, if any, recognition of what occurs between the 1961 publication of the former work and the 1974 publication of the latter. Over a dozen years pass without any discussion of Lévinas's work during the 60s, namely Difficile Liberté (1963), Quatre lecturese talmudiques (1968), and Humanisme de l'autre homme (1972). Rather, Buckingham is content to note that Jacques Derrida's 1964 study of TI in "Violence et métaphysique: Essai sur la pensée d'Emmanuel Lévinas" may have been the main motivation for his turn to anti-storytelling. However, there is no serious engagement with Derrida's essay -- or any other cause -- to determine the source of Lévinas's change in attitude concerning storytelling. Buckingham is content to refer to Robert Bernasconi's claim that "Levinas nowhere responds explicitly" to Derrida's "Violence et métaphysique" -- and to leave his anti-storytelling turn "unexplained" (128; Bernasconi 1991, 153).

The lack of explanation of Lévinas's alleged turn from storytelling in AE s a huge hole in this project, and the failure to engage with Derrida feels like a missed opportunity. But even so, the reportage errors or mistakes Buckingham makes regarding Derrida's critique of Lévinas are simply embarrassing: 1) "Violence et métaphysique" is said to be Derrida's "1976 study of Lévinas's Totality and Infinity" (128), whereas the essay was actually published in 1964; 2) the year of English translation of Derrida's Writing and Difference is listed in the bibliography as 1978, but alternately cited on page 128 as 1976 and 1978; 3) Alan Bass is listed as co-author of Writing and Difference in the bibliography; and 4) nowhere is it mentioned that L'écriture et la différance, a collection of Derrida's essays written between 1959 and 1967, was published in the latter year -- the year of "Derrida's emergence as a major figure in contemporary French thought" (Bass 1978, x).

My point is not to quibble over Buckingham's use and misuse of dates, but rather to point out that they are in effect irrelevant to his argument and illustrate his method of textual explication. TI and AE are placed in dialogue with each other both outside of their historical, cultural and intellectual framework, as well as outside of their genealogy within Lévinas's body of work. This method of textual explication may work for many situations; however, given Lévinas's alleged reversal in philosophical style, it rings hollow and leaves something to be desired. Knowing, for example, that Derrida published his important commentary on Lévinas's work just a few years after its publication -- and that Lévinas's alleged "response" to it did not come until 1974, over ten years later -- should not just be brushed under the carpet. Why? Because post-1967 Derrida becomes the darling of the French theoretical mainstream and an intellectual force to be reckoned with. In fact, we even know that in October of 1964, Derrida sent Lévinas a copy of "Violence et métaphysique," and received the following response from him:

I immediately want -- after a first reading -- to thank you for sending me your texts, with their dedications, for all the trouble you have taken to read me, comment on me and refute me so vigorously. . . . I must tell you of my great admiration for the intellectual power deployed in these pages, so generous even when they are ironic and severe. Heartfelt thanks for everything.[2]

Thus the question: Was Lévinas's change in philosophical style, that is, his shift from stories to anti-stories, the result of Derrida's critique or was it simply motivated by his internal philosophical development? While Buckingham seems to veer toward the later explanation, he does not go into many specifics.

Furthermore, there is little sense even that Lévinas is writing these works in French and is an important contributor to French intellectual thought, as none of the original titles are mentioned nor is any of the native language utilized, with the sole exception of Lévinas's famous il y a. But the most glaring absence in this study is due to the author's decision to avoid the religious dimensions of Lévinas's work. "As a decidedly non-godly reader of Levinas," writes Buckingham,

I will not be attempting to avoid the question of God in Levinas's work -- something that would leave nothing of the work other than an unfleshed skeleton -- but will instead be attempting to take what could be called a broadly phenomenological route of bracketing out the language and the idea of God from the questions that Levinas explores. (4)

 I would add to this as well that politics, French intellectual history, the Holocaust, Auschwitz, and Nazi totalitarianism are all also "bracketed out." What then is left?

What is left is a fairly straight-forward argument. Lévinas picked up his penchant for storytelling from Rosenzweig, an "advocate of storytelling," and Husserl, "the reluctant teller of tales" (8). Buckingham argues that TI is a "story-cycle" and "fractured drama"

rooted in ontological horror and the tragic heroism of the subject whose time diverges radically from the time of the world and of history; passing through bucolic tales of labour and dwelling to then take on an erotic form in the arrival of the silent, feminine other; moving on to the radical break with the comfort and security of the dwelling that takes place in the encounter with the absolutely other person, the stranger who messianically launches the metaphysical quest; and turning back to a stitching together of the possibility of a moral community and of a history in which meaning might be possible through the relationship between fathers, sons and brothers. (101)

Then, after all of the stories of TI, "his next major work," AE, "turned [its] back on storytelling" (109). It is "a book that deliberately seeks to disrupt our own tendencies towards philosophical storytelling" (130) -- it "is not so much an argument as it is a turbulent swarm of dramatically laden terms; and any attempt to resolve this swarming language into something like a single line of argument would fail to do the book justice" (135). Buckingham then concludes his study by asking what ethics looks like after AE-- a text that raises the question whether it is "talking about ethics at all?" (142).

So, then, how do we do justice to Buckingham's book? For one, the position that Lévinas's two volumes are bookends of a sort regarding storytelling is a fascinating one. But it is also one that raises more questions about storytelling -- and anti-storytelling -- in Lévinas than it answers. Even the most basic questions, "What is a story?" and "What is storytelling?" are not addressed in this book. There is a certain assumption that they are in some way primitive terms. However, even just a sample of contemporary narrative theory disabuses one of thisassumption.

Furthermore, the move from storytelling to anti-storytelling needs a least a bit more context. Storytelling and anti-storytelling do not just arise ex nihilo in these works -- and situating their rise and fall would add some depth to the project. Still, Buckingham's framework is intriguing: "If Totality and Infinity explores the adventures and itineraries of the subject . . . [then] Otherwise than Being plunges into the heart of the subject to ask how ethics is possible at all" (131). "One could say," comments Buckingham,

that Levinas is interested in finding [in AE] the conditions of possibility for the stories that he has told in Totality and Infinity, although without turning these conditions of possibility into another story that could be mastered by the subject." (131)

Buckingham's project opens up many possibilities for exploring the connections between ethics and philosophical style, and here drawing out the connections with contemporary narrative ethicists such as Martha Nussbaum, Stanley Cavell, and Alasdair MacIntyre would be interesting.

To do this book justice is to view it as the highly personal work of a young philosopher coming to terms with two books that he finds intriguing, impenetrable, and formative. Himself a published novelist and children's literature author, Buckingham reveals how he has come to make sense of two of the seminal works by this notoriously difficult philosopher. Of TI, he writes, "I have lived with this book and it has formed me" (56); of AE, he confesses, "I have read and re-read . . . [it] over the years with the curiously nagging sense that as I am reading,something is taking place" (111). I appreciate Buckingham's effort to deal with Lévinas's philosophical style, and I am generally convinced of a difference in style between the two books.  However, this project raises more questions than it answers. Ultimately, this book is an account of one philosopher's struggle to make sense of Lévinas -- and a record of what the author takes to be success.


Bass, Alan. "Translator's Introduction." Derrida, Writing and Difference. ix-xx.

Bernasconi, Robert. "Skepticism in the Face of Philosophy." In Re-Reading Levinas, eds. Robert Bernasconi and Simon Critchley. London and New York: Continuum, 1991. 149-61.

Buckingham, Will. Naïve Phenomenology: Thinking Ethics through Stories. Ph.D. Thesis. Stoke on Trent: Staffordshire University, 2007.

Derrida, Jacques. "Violence et métaphysique: Essai sur la pensée d'Emmanuel Lévinas." Revue de métaphysique et de morale 3-4 (1964). Reprinted and translated in Writing and Difference (1978).

_____. L'écriture et la différance. Paris: Seuil, 1967.

_____. Writing and Difference. Trans. Alan Bass. Chicago: University of Chicago Press, 1978.

Lévinas, Emmanuel. Totalité et Infini. Essai sur l'extériorité. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1961.

_____. Totality and Infinity: An Essay on Exteriority. Trans. Alphonso Lingis. Pittsburgh, PA: Duquesne University Press, 1969.

_____. Autrement qu'être ou au-delà de l'essence. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1974.

_____. Otherwise Than Being: Or, Beyond Essence. Trans. Alphonso Lingis. The Hague: Martinus Nijhoff, 1981.

Peeters, Benoît. Derrida: A Biography. Trans. Andrew Brown. Malden, MA: Polity Press, 2013.

[1] Buckingham’s Ph.D. dissertation, Naïve Phenomenology: Thinking Ethics through Stories, was defended in 2007 at Staffordshire University.  As he is just over five years out of graduate school, I think it is fair to call him a “young” philosopher.  Based on the title of his Ph.D. thesis, the book under review is presumably connected with work done in his thesis. 

[2] “Letter from Emmanuel Lévinas to Jacques Derrida,” 22 October 1964.  Cited in Benoît Peeters, Derrida: A Biography, p. 140.