Liberal Eugenics: In Defence of Human Enhancement

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Nicholas Agar, Liberal Eugenics: In Defence of Human Enhancement, Blackwell Publishing, 2004, 205pp, $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 1405123907.

Reviewed by Michael Hauskeller, University of Exeter


The title of this clear, scientifically well informed and philosophically sophisticated study is slightly misleading. What Agar is primarily interested in and what he strives to defend is not so much human enhancement as reproductive freedom. Whereas traditional eugenics is concerned with the improvement of human stock and its proponents consequently advocate a strict regulation of reproduction, Agar does not want to commit himself to a particular view of what would count as such an improvement. People have different conceptions of what makes a good life and what characteristics are desirable. From a liberal perspective, these differences ought to be respected, which rules out any form of authoritarian eugenics. What humans should be like is not for the State to decide. For the same reason, however, people should also be free to use enhancement technologies on their children in order to realize their own personal conception of human excellence, i.e. to make their children, in accordance with their own standards, better than they would otherwise be. Here, likewise, the state has no right to interfere. Just as a liberal outlook precludes any form of authoritarian eugenics, it encourages us to adopt a liberal eugenics which embraces not a monistic but a pluralistic view of human excellence. In this manner, "an evil doctrine" is being transformed into "a morally acceptable one." (135)

Unlike philosophers such as Jonathan Glover or John Harris, Agar does not claim that we have a moral duty to provide and use enhancement technologies. However, he argues that consistency with the moral values prevalent in a contemporary liberal democracy requires us to tolerate their development and use. There is no particular ethical theory on which Agar bases his conclusions. Instead of arguing from a Kantian, a utilitarian or any other ethical theory's perspective, he is looking for practices which we have already accepted as morally justified or, on the contrary, as not justifiable. By comparing a still unfamiliar practice to similar but familiar practices which "elicit moral reactions of which we are confident" (39), we get hold of moral images which indicate how morally to evaluate the unfamiliar. This "method of moral images" helps us to decide, without recourse to ethical theory, whether we ought to ban, tolerate or encourage the use of enhancement technologies. Since Agar wants to convince us that we should tolerate the development and use of enhancement technologies, he needs to demonstrate that those moral images which would support his view are in relevant respects closer to the practice of genetic enhancement than those that would rather support its ban or, on the contrary, an obligation to make use of it.

The first image Agar considers, and eventually rejects, is the moral image of therapy. Buchanan et al. have argued that the state can be said to have an obligation to provide gene therapy and parents an obligation to use it on their children. So the image of therapy supports obligations which are alien to the declared spirit of a liberal eugenics. However, Agar seems to accept Buchanan's conclusions as long as the scope of obligations is strictly confined to the prevention and treatment of disease. While there may be an obligation to use, if available, biotechnological means in order to prevent and treat diseases, there should be no obligation for parents to enhance their children or for the state to provide them with the necessary means of enhancement. Hence, therapy is to be rejected as an adequate moral image for the case in question. Other images need to be found that are more appropriate, i.e., in relevant respects more similar to genetic enhancement.

One promising candidate for such a moral image is that of nature. This image is often used by conservatives in order to demonstrate the wrongness of all or most forms of genetic engineering. The image of nature is usually invoked not to support the toleration but, instead, the ban of enhancement technologies. Thus, Fukuyama, amongst others, has argued that such technologies are an offense against human nature which in effect disappears in the process. Whether this is actually the case can, of course, be disputed, but even if it is, it also needs to be shown that the loss of human nature matters. Agar maintains that this has not been convincingly shown yet, and he himself does not seem to believe that it would be much of a loss.

However, the moral image of nature can also be employed to support Agar's liberal conclusions. By simply reversing the direction of Fukuyama's arguments he derives the following "nature principle": "If we are permitted to leave unchanged a given genetic arrangement in the genomes of our future children, we are also permitted to introduce it." (99) In other words, if we don't think that a certain genetic arrangement is, or produces, a serious impairment so that we are obliged to change it, then there is no moral reason why we should not be allowed to bring it about. As long as we do not consider, for instance, high intelligence or blue eyes as harmful to the individual and therefore in need of treatment and our tools of genetic engineering are reliably precise and safe, we ought to be free to use them in order to create highly intelligent and blue-eyed children. Agar concedes that one could just as well argue that low intelligence is not harmful either and might even enable us to be happier than we would otherwise be (by helping us to enjoy the simple pleasures of life more easily). But even if that were not so, as long as we do not regard low intelligence as a condition which deserves treatment, we ought, following the nature principle, to be allowed to deliberately create children who are less intelligent than they would be without the use of genetic engineering. Basically, there is only one restriction to reproductive freedom and the right to use genetic-enhancement technologies that Agar recognizes, namely the diminution of "real freedom". Unfortunately, it is not entirely clear what real freedom means. Despite this unclarity Agar believes that reducing IQ by means of genetic engineering (given that this will be possible one day) does not necessarily reduce real freedom whereas, for instance, wilfully creating a deaf child does, even when this child is meant to live with deaf parents and in a deaf community.

Yet the moral image of nature is not the only one upon which Agar rests his case. Rather, it is backed by another moral image, that of nurture. It is common to draw a distinction between environmental and genetic changes and to consider this distinction morally relevant. We normally don't think there is anything morally wrong with shaping our children's environment in order to influence their development and, thereby, what kind of people they are going to be. On the contrary, we expect parents to form their children, that is, to provide an adequate environment for them so that they are likely to develop certain abilities and character traits. Yet many people seem to think that doing the very same thing by means of genetic engineering is morally unacceptable. Agar, however, argues that drawing a distinction between changes brought about by means of genetic engineering and those brought about by means of education is entirely arbitrary. There is, contrary to what is claimed by J├╝rgen Habermas and others, nothing in education that makes it intrinsically better than genetic enhancement. Both are just two different, but basically morally equivalent, ways of manufacturing people. Social influences are not in any way softer than genetic influences. The one can be just as uncontestable as the other, and neither determines a child's future. There is thus always room for individual decisions which defy the original planning. "Although genomic information may give parents the power to influence the probability that a given life plan will be chosen, it is unlikely that the probability could ever be raised to the point of reliability." (125) Agar rejects genetic determinism and derives the following "nurture principle" which complements his nature principle: "If we are permitted to produce certain traits by modifying our children's environments, then we are also permitted to produce them by modifying their genomes." (113)

Of course, this does not answer the question which modifications ought to be permitted. Obviously, there are also ways of "educating" children which we would not find morally acceptable. And just as we can "unduly influence" our children by the way we raise them, we can presumably also unduly influence them by certain modifications of their genomes. If there are such modifications, they should, according to Agar, be banned. With one exception, all others should be permitted. The exception concerns the elimination of socially constructed disadvantages that are built upon such morally irrelevant phenomena as skin colour or homosexuality. Curiously, because quite in contrast to his decidedly liberal outlook, Agar argues that prospective parents should not be allowed to genetically manipulate their offspring in such a way that they won't have to suffer from racism or homophobia. Although "the fact that dark-skinned people suffer only because they live in a social environment shaped to some extent by morally wrong racist attitudes does not make any less real their suffering" (155) and the "mere recognition that a certain harm has its origins in a morally defective environment does not alter its reality" (156), biotechnological solutions to complex social problems are to be rejected because they will most likely deflect bigotry and prevent us from changing the bad circumstances which inflict the suffering in the first place. This conclusion is rather surprising, not because the argument is unconvincing but because it clearly violates Agar's nature principle. We would not, after all, consider having a light skin or having a heterosexual disposition as something that ought to be remedied. Hence, if we stick to the nature principle, we ought to be allowed to manufacture heterosexual and light-skinned children. Of course, Agar has a perfectly good reason for accepting this inconsistency. Yet that does not persuade him to discard the nature principle. What he overlooks, though, is that the deflection argument which he uses with regard to the biotechnological elimination of socially constructed disadvantages can be turned against all attempts at genetic enhancement. Once we can, for instance, construct more intelligent people we are not very likely to bother anymore with trying to create an environment in which the less intelligent can lead a life worth living. The whole idea of genetic enhancement is a deflection, for it generally encourages us to seek biotechnological solutions for social problems.

Although Agar's position is placed, in his own view, somewhere between the two extremes of conservativism and transhumanism, he clearly has no sympathies for the former. Even though he does not unconditionally endorse "the idea that we should use technological means to increase the psychological and physical vigour of our descendents" (19), he does endorse it in principle. Those who do not endorse it, even conditionally, are reprimanded for not being able to give any "rationally persuasive reasons" in support of their view. Eventually, anti-enhancement arguments all seem to boil down to a vague (albeit strong) feeling of unease, the famous 'yuck' factor. For Agar, there is no wisdom in repugnance, as Leon Kass and others have claimed. Relying on one's repugnance and similar feelings is a form of cheating because it places the conclusion that, e.g., cloning (somatic cell transfer) and genetic engineering are morally wrong, beyond reason's reach. Rationality, it seems, is clearly on the side of the liberals. Moreover, the "moral images of racism and homophobia show why we should not accept uncritically the message of our guts about the moral status of other people." (57) But are those images, as Agar assumes, really at all similar to the widespread unease about the use of genetic enhancement? One crucial difference could be that we have very strong moral reasons for not giving way to racism and homophobia, but much weaker reasons for embracing genetic enhancement.

There is, of course, also the question of the possible risks of employing a new and hitherto untested technology. We simply don't know what will happen when we try to genetically engineer our children. Perhaps the whole enterprise will end in disaster. So we should act according to the precautionary principle and not take the risk. Agar considers this practical objection but eventually rejects it, and again, given his liberal premises, for a curious reason. "Enhancement technologies", Agar claims, "actually do present potential benefits of a magnitude comparable with the nearly infinite potential penalties imagined by opponents." (163) They do because many generations would profit so that the initially slight benefits would gradually increase. So the reason why we should allow parents to "realize their procreative visions" is not so much our respect for their autonomy which commits us to letting them make their own individual choices and preferences, but rather the benefits for later generations that are believed to result from it. What Agar fails to clarify, though, is wherein exactly these alleged benefits are supposed to consist. If we don't commit ourselves to a particular conception of the good and, instead, with Agar, adopt a pluralistic view of human excellence (so we can leave it to prospective parents to decide what kind of children they wish to have), how then can we be so sure that any benefit at all will come of it? Obviously, we cannot have it both ways: Either we do not decide on what would count as an improvement of human stock and let everybody make their own individual decisions; then we have no good reason to overrule the precautionary principle. Or we do commit ourselves to a certain view of human excellence; then we can balance likely gains and losses and possibly override the precautionary principle but also seem to be morally obliged to keep reproductive freedom within the limits of our notion of improvement. We should then not only allow people to genetically enhance their children but positively encourage them, or even commit them by law, to do so. In other words, liberal eugenics faces the dilemma of either wilfully ignoring the risks of genetic enhancement or turning itself into a form of authoritarian eugenics.

Yet even if we just stick to the liberal core idea that people should be free to make their own choices, including technologically assisted reproductive choices, the resulting freedom is more fiction than reality. People may have different conceptions of the good, but some are clearly more prevalent than others. Should we ever become able to genetically engineer longevity or intelligence, people will not for long be able to justify not using the technology in order to raise the intelligence of their children or give them the opportunity of a longer life. Isn't that a severe limitation of "real freedom" which, eventually, makes a liberal eugenics a self-defeating enterprise?