Liberal Faith: Essays in Honor of Philip Quinn

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Paul J. Weithman (ed.), Liberal Faith: Essays in Honor of Philip Quinn, U. of Notre Dame Press, 2008, 216pp., $40.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780268044169.

Reviewed by Ted Poston, University of South Alabama



Liberal Faith is a collection of essays organized around Philip Quinn’s research interests, in particular Quinn’s interest in working out his Christian faith within a commitment to a broadly liberal agenda. The book includes papers in epistemology (by Linda Zagzebski and Richard Foley), philosophy of religion (by Eleonore Stump and Paul J. Griffiths), and political philosophy (by Robert Audi, Paul J. Weithman, and Sumner B. Twiss). Weithman provides a helpful introduction that summarizes each paper and connects the papers with themes from Quinn’s research. In addition, Weithman includes a touching eulogy for Quinn at the end of the volume. In view of Weithman’s useful summary of the papers, I will forgo another summary and instead focus on a few of the papers that stood out. I end with an extended discussion of Eleonore Stump’s superb contribution “Presence and Omnipresence”.

Liberal Faith is a fine tribute to an excellent philosopher. As the diverse nature of the essays reveal, Philip Quinn had a remarkable range of interests in philosophy. What is more notable is Quinn’s ability to write on these topics with the upmost clarity and sensitivity to the fundamental issues. A hallmark of Quinn’s scholarship is his facility to wield the tools of analytic philosophy while also revealing a depth of liberal arts knowledge. Liberal Faith honors Quinn’s memory in this respect by bringing together a group of first-rate philosophers to work on the issues Quinn cared deeply about. Paul Weithman is to be thanked for bringing together this collection of essays.

Linda Zagzebski’s paper, “Self-Trust and the Diversity of Religions”, presents a novel take on the problem of religious diversity. Building on Richard Foley’s work on intellectual self-trust, Zagzebski argues that we must also trust our emotions. In particular, if we admire an adherent from a different religious tradition, self-trust commits us to trusting our respect for that person. As Zagzebski presents it, this admiration involves the thought that if I had grown up in a different context I would imitate this person. This strengthens the problem of religious diversity by including a deep respect for saints from other traditions which provides a window through which we may see an alternative self.

It is unclear exactly what to make of this added dimension to the problem of religious diversity. Readers of Herman Hesse’s Siddharta are often moved by his allegorical tale of the young Buddha as I was when I first read it. I still continue to have a deep admiration for Siddharta and I recognize that if I grew up in a different tradition I would imitate Siddharta. But so what? How does this undermine my evidence that the central claims of Christianity are true? Perhaps Zagzebski’s point is just to undermine a certain brand of exclusivism on which the moral virtues are exclusive to a particular religious tradition. But excepting this implausible form of exclusivism, it’s not clear how Zagzebki’s emphasis on the role of emotions strengthens the problem of religious diversity.

Paul J. Griffiths paper “Self-Annihilation or Damnation?” provides a fascinating study of traditional Christian views on the final state of persons. Griffiths observes that by the fourth century, Christian eschatology could easily yield the result that people can annihilate themselves, i.e., completely remove themselves from existence by ceasing to participate in the divine life. Griffiths notes, though, that both Augustine and Aquinas explicitly and yet unsatisfactorily resist this implication. Griffiths ends by sketching a view of annihilation that coheres with this earlier eschatological tradition. Fans of C.S. Lewis’s The Great Divorce will find Griffiths’ essay a welcome exploration of the kind of eschatology Lewis imaginatively portrays. Like Lewis, Griffiths suggests that persons can gradually remove themselves from participating in divine life and so literally come to nothing. Griffiths observes that this frightening possibility helps to remove the objection that annihilationist views fail to uphold the moral seriousness of human sin.

Robert Audi’s essay, “Moral Foundations of Liberal Democracy, Secular Reasons, and Liberal Neutrality toward the Good”, aims to provide a moral grounding for a liberal democracy and, also, to evaluate the extent to which this grounding supports a substantive conception of the good. Audi argues that an intuitionist approach can provide an adequate grounding for liberal democracy, and further that this grounding can support a substantive view of human flourishing. Audi’s intuitionist approach supports what he calls “the principle of secular rationale” according to which “citizens have a prima facie obligation not to advocate or support any law or public policy that restricts human conduct, unless they have, and are willing to offer, adequate secular reason for this advocacy or support” (p. 139). My concerns with this principle are similar to one’s voiced by Phil Quinn in his paper “Political Liberalisms and Their Exclusions of the Religious”. To mention just one issue, there is likely to be no agreement on what counts as a secular rationale and so the exclusion of religious reasons smacks of unfairness (see Weithman’s introduction pp. 18-20 for a discussion of this issue).

In his introduction Weithman observes that contributors to a commemorative volume like this “are supposed to honor Phil by putting their talents to work advancing discussion of a representative sample of the questions he cared about” (p. 2). Eleonore Stump’s contribution, “Presence and Omnipresence”, exemplifies this goal. Her aim in this paper is to explore the nature of union with a beloved friend such as the friendship between Sam and Frodo in JRR Tolkien’s The Lord of the Rings. Stump’s paper admirably succeeds in bringing to light a host of issues connected with this topic.

Stump’s paper is rich and deserves a close reading. She begins by observing that “union between friends requires mutual closeness and personal presence” (p. 60). This union is not achieved merely by being in the other’s presence. This observation leads Stump to distinguish between minimal personal presence and significant personal presence (see p. 61). Minimal personal presence can be achieved simply by being in the same room as another person and it doesn’t involve closeness between persons. A more valuable form of personal presence is significant personal presence. This, she says, is “a particularly significant or powerful way of being close to a person” (p. 62). This kind of presence is lacking when a person is “distracted all through dinner and … [is] never really present to me” (p. 61).

Stump then proceeds to criticize an earlier account of personal presence that she developed with Norman Kretzmann. On that account one person is present to another if “they have direct and unmediated causal contact with and cognitive access to another” (p. 62). Direct and unmediated causal contact requires only that the contact “does not have as an intermediate step the agency of another person” (p. 62). Stump thinks this account “misses something even in the minimal sense of personal presence” because the account falsely implies that, e.g., Zeus would be present to the scene of the Greek and Trojan War when he is having dinner in Ethiopia (p. 62, 63). More importantly, this account is even more inadequate for understanding the nature of significant personal presence.

To improve upon her and Kretzmann’s earlier account of presence, Stump claims that significant personal presence requires both second-person experience and joint or shared attention. What is second-person experience? Stump explains:

One person Paula has a second-person experience of another person Jerome only if (1) Paula is conscious of Jerome as a person; (2) in being conscious of Jerome as a person, Paula has direct and unmediated cognitive access to Jerome and is in a position to have direct and unmediated causal contact with him; and (3) Jerome is conscious (p. 63).

Assuming that cognitive contact is a kind of causal contact and that direct and unmediated cognitive access to J requires that J is conscious, we can express this necessary condition for second-person experience more succinctly as follows: P has second-person experience of J only if in P’s being conscious of J as a person, P has direct and unmediated cognitive access to J. On Stump’s view second-person experience doesn’t require direct sensory contact with another person. For example, Paula can have a second-person experience of Jerome through email exchanges (see p. 64 and fn 11 on p. 78). An interesting question is whether one individual can have a second-person experience of a historical figure. Does second-person experience of another require that the other exists (see fns 12 and 13, pp. 78-9)?

Second-person experience, though, isn’t sufficient for significant personal experience. For that kind of personal presence, joint or shared attention is required as well. Stump discusses joint attention via recent studies on autism. Though joint attention is difficult to describe, it is clearly missing in some autistic children. She quotes Peter Hobson as saying that joint awareness requires

[that one] needs to be aware of the object of event as the focus of the other person’s attention — and in addition, for full ‘jointness,’ he or she should share awareness of the sharing of the focus, something that often entails sharing an attitude towards the thing or event in question (quoted on p. 66).

Stump calls our attention to a more fundamental form of joint attention: dyadic joint attention or dyadic shared attention (p. 67). One puzzle for researchers on autism is that while autistic children are capable of joint attention they don’t engage in dyadic attention. Stump claims that part of the answer has to do “with the fact that there is voluntary control of attention” (p. 67). She thinks that dyadic shared attention has a special role to play in significant personal presence. Shared attention requires mutual awareness of another which involves awareness of the other’s awareness of you and further even awareness of this. Shared attention, thus, is like common knowledge.

The last stage in Stump’s analysis of the nature of union between beloved friends is an investigation on closeness. She begins by observing that shared attention is maximally rich when there is a relation of mutual closeness between the persons (p. 69). What is this relation of mutual closeness? It is difficult to say. Stump observes that propinquity is not sufficient for mutual closeness and, further, adding lively conservation and general benevolence to physical proximity doesn’t suffice for mutual closeness. This is because all three may be present even though the participants are radically isolated from each other (see p. 71).

What then can be said about closeness? Stump contends that closeness requires the other person’s willingness to share significant thoughts and feelings. For Paula to be close to Jerome it requires that Jerome is willing to share significant thoughts and feelings with her (p. 71). Paula can’t be close to Jerome merely by sharing her thoughts and feelings because it requires something on Jerome’s part. Both have to be willing to treat the exchange as meaningful. A further part of Stump’s characterization of closeness involves the role of the will. Though hard to characterize, closeness requires a desire for the other person along with a vulnerability to the other person (see pp. 72-3). Finally, she observes that closeness requires that a person is not self-alienated (p. 74). Closeness demands that a person is integrated within herself and also that the person is wholehearted (p. 75).

So what is the nature of union between beloved friends? In the final analysis this union requires significant personal presence and mutual closeness. This account carries interesting implications for union with God. Stump observes that God can’t be close to an individual alienated from himself (p. 76). Union with God requires a personal integration. An interesting variant on this implication is the Augustinian claim that the kind of personal integration necessary for union with God may require God’s grace. In this case, if an individual is to enter into union with God it requires the divine grace to restore a person to wholeness.

Another implication of Stump’s account for union with God is that, according to her, “the only thing decisive for the kind of personal presence, significant or minimal, that an omnipresent God has to a human person is thus the state and condition of the human person himself” (p. 76). Again She writes, “if Paula wants God to be significantly present to her, the establishment of the relationship she wants depends only on her, on her single-mindedly and wholeheartedly wanting that relationship” (p. 76). But this claim doesn’t seem right. Theists have attested to the dark night of the soul in which God removes his comforting presence for a time. The book of Psalms is replete with references to God hiding his face (e.g., Ps 13:1; Ps 22:2; Ps 30:7). It appears, therefore, that God has the ability to withdraw his presence for a time, even though people may do what they can to enter into such a relationship. Furthermore, it is unclear why Stump thinks her analysis implies that significant personal presence with God depends only on the human person himself. Granted, God is minimally present everywhere in Aquinas’s sense that God can act anywhere and knows whatever occurs. But to achieve significant personal presence God has to choose to reveal himself in a particularly meaningful way. So, it doesn’t appear to be the case that Stump’s analysis of omnipresence is committed to this one-way dependence. However, her general analysis of significant personal presence rightly stresses the role of an individual’s self-revelation. Self-revelation is risky and with respect to God self-revelation requires searing honesty. To borrow her earlier example of Jerome and Paula, if Jerome is unwilling to reveal his deepest motives and thoughts to Paula, then even if Jerome makes a show at self-revelation, there will be no union between beloved friends. This verdict is especially secure when Paula knows that Jerome’s intentions are less than pure. If this judgment fits some relationships between persons, then we have even more reason to think that it fits a relationship with God. Stump is right, therefore, to lay stress on the role of the individual in entering into a significant relationship with God. Overall, her account of the nature of the union with a beloved friend raises a number of fascinating issues. I hope that her contribution will gain the attention it deserves.