Liberal Politics and Public Faith: Beyond Separation

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Kevin Vallier, Liberal Politics and Public Faith: Beyond Separation, Routledge, 2014, 286pp., $145.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415737135.

Reviewed by Lori Watson, University of San Diego


Kevin Vallier has written a fantastic book. It makes a significant and original contribution to the literature on public reason liberalism, and anyone interested in liberalism should add it to the top of her reading list. Vallier, a self-described public reason liberal, develops his liberalism in a very distinct fashion from political liberalism (the liberalism most associated with public reason). In doing so, he raises important challenges for the traditional defenders of political liberalism, namely, those following in the Rawlsian tradition. However, I think Vallier fails to appreciate how distinct his project is from the Rawlsian project, and so his view isn't a direct challenge to political liberalism but rather a different way of conceiving the project of liberalism.

Vallier is deeply concerned with the charge that liberalism is insufficiently respectful or accommodating of religious believers in liberal polities. On his reading, the dominant forms of public reason liberalism advantage secular worldviews and secular liberalism over religiously oriented worldviews, so much so that religious reasoning is in effect "privatized." The concern that religiously oriented citizens experience an increasingly hostile public in liberal democracies is a charge he finds well grounded against traditional secular liberalisms and political liberalisms. However, advancing liberal principles does not entail a commitment to secularism, according to Vallier; liberalism can, and should be, reclaimed by those who think that religious reasons deserve a prominent, or at least equal, place in political life. This reclamation project requires showing that a proper understanding of justificatory reasons within liberalism does not, in fact, require the exclusion of religiously grounded reasons despite the fact that many liberals, and public reason liberals in particular, have thought they do.

Vallier begins his substantive project by articulating the master principle of public reason liberalism, the Public Justification Principle, (PJP), according to which "coercion is permissible only when each member of the public has sufficient reason to endorse the coercion" (p. 4). The dominant forms of public reason liberalism hold that public justification entails a principle of exclusion of nonshared or nonaccessible reasons, of which religious reasons are a subset. Further, they hold a principle of restraint, according to which citizens must restrain themselves from offering nonshared or nonaccessible reasons as justificatory for the use of political power. Vallier argues that neither a principle of exclusion nor a principle of restraint follows from the PJP. Rather some bridging principle or concept must be relied upon to establish that exclusion or restraint follows from the requirement for public justification. Exclusion is justified by an account of justificatory reasons as either accessible or sharable, which he thinks are poor accounts of such reasons. There are two arguments prominently offered to justify a principle of restraint, a respect for persons argument and a stability-based argument, but according to Vallier ultimately neither is sufficient to ground a principle of restraint.

Vallier raises three objections to arguments for a principle of restraint: the integrity objection, the fairness objection, and the divisiveness objection. In brief, those objections are: principles of restraint undermine the integrity of some religious believers, principles of restraint treat citizens of faith unfairly relative to secular citizens, and the claim that the introduction of religious reasons into political justification will increase divisiveness and undermine stability is false.

In offering an alternative account of public reason liberalism that is not subject to the criticisms raised above, Vallier identifies two desiderata for evaluating conceptions of justificatory reasons: respect for personal integrity and respect for reasonable pluralism and diversity. If his account of justificatory reasons is superior to standard accounts of justificatory reasons in preserving respect for integrity and respect for reasonable pluralism, then he will have offered a powerful argument for public reason liberals to embrace convergence accounts of public reasons.

A convergence account of justificatory reasons holds that such reasons need only be intelligible to all members of the public. This is a much weaker account of justificatory reasons than is expressed in consensus accounts that require such reasons to be either "accessible" or "sharable." Vallier argues that accessibility accounts -- those that require justificatory reasons to rest upon common evaluative standards -- either fail to achieve their aims or fail to adequately respect the twin desiderata of integrity and diversity. To the first claim, the failure to achieve its aims, he argues that even arguments from natural theology and religious testimony meet the accessibility requirement. Therefore relying on accessible, common evaluative standards as a basis for restricting public reasons to non-religious reasons will not do the work intended by its defenders. Moreover, even though it may not rule out some of the religiously oriented reasons defenders of accessibility had hoped it would, accessibility still excludes too much. Accessibility will rule out intelligible but inaccessible reasons and in so doing will fail to respect the integrity of citizens and draw the scope of reasonable pluralism too narrowly.

Vallier's next target is sharability accounts -- those accounts that require justificatory reasons to rely on shared evaluative standards and shared reasons. He evaluates the arguments for sharability and finds none of them persuasive. Even more, sharability ranks lower than accessibility on the metric of our two desiderata and substantially lower than intelligibility. A wide range of citizens' reasons will be denied the status of justificatory reasons, and we should reject this restrictive account in favor of a "bigger tent" public reason liberalism if possible.

Vallier claims that a "bigger tent" public reason liberalism is possible. A convergence account of justificatory reasons adopts an intelligibility standard of justificatory reasons, according to which:

(1)  A's reason (R) is intelligible iff "members of the public regard (R) as epistemically justified for A according to A's evaluative standards" (p. 106)


(2)  "A's reason (R) can figure into a justification for (or rejection of) a coercive law L only if it is intelligible to all members of the public" (p. 106).

Some important features of this account are worth underscoring. First, an intelligible reason must be seen as intelligible as a reason for A from the point of view of the public. From this it follows that members of the public need not regard A's reason as a reason for them in any sense. Second, they may reject her evaluative standards altogether. Hence, the intelligibility requirement "employs agent-relative evaluative standards by permitting standards to differ among members of the public" (p. 107).

The argument for intelligibility is just this: "the intelligibility requirement is entailed by the idea of reasoning from the standpoint of others" (p. 107). In order to count your reasons as reasons, I must be able to see them as such relying upon your (agent-relative) evaluative standards. If I can't see your "reasons" as issuing reasons even from your own standpoint, I cannot be said to reason from your standpoint.

Having made the case that a convergence account of justificatory reasons is superior to accessibility and sharability accounts because it affords greater respect for integrity (fewer of citizens' reasons will be excluded from public justification) and draws the scope of reasonable pluralism more broadly, Vallier must "save it" from resurrecting the case for restraint by offering a moderate account of idealized agents. An overly idealized or radical account of idealization will be too restrictive of justificatory reasons.

Vallier's defense of moderate idealization is dense and rich; I only briefly sketch the broad strokes of the argument here. He spends the bulk of the Chapter (5) criticizing a radical conception of idealization on two grounds: it "borders on incoherence" and it fails to satisfy our two desiderata (p. 160). His aim is to demonstrate a plausible account of "moderately idealized agents," as characterized along three relevant dimensions.

The Rationality Dimension: Moderately idealized agents "rarely optimize, they engage in nonterminating reasoning and they make defeasible inferences" (p. 161). They make justified choices rather than warranted ones. In short, they are subject to reasoning constraints in much they same way that we are and are not fully rational as in more radical idealizations.

The Informational Dimension: Agents' practical interests (in their projects and goals) specify what kinds of information they need. Information ascribed to moderately idealized agents is attributed to them on the basis of relevance, collection costs, and processing costs. Thus, in contrast to radically idealized agents, they are not presumed to have anything like full information.

Reasonableness Dimension: An agent is reasonable if she has:

           i.         A disposition to engage in public justification, and abide by justified principles.

         ii.         A disposition to recognize "the burdens of judgment."

        iii.         A disposition to reject the repression of other reasonable points of view (p. 147).

Moderately idealized agents reasons more closely resemble our own reasons for action than do the reasons of radically idealized agents. This account of agents is superior to a radical idealization insofar as it effectively preserves integrity, for moderately idealized "agents" reasons will more closely resemble our own. And it accommodates reasonable pluralism more effectively than a radical idealized account because it permits a broader characterization of agents' reasons.

So far I have outlined the argumentative structure and claims of the core of the book. The remaining two chapters (6 and 7) take on more applied issues, namely, religious accommodation and public education, respectively. I don't have the space to engage with these careful and engaging arguments. However, there is one more crucial element to the view that we need before assessing Vallier's ambitious project. This is the Principle of Intelligible Exclusion, according to which "law-making bodies must (i) only impose laws on members of the public that members of the public have sufficient intelligible reasons to endorse and (ii) repeal or reform laws that members of the public have sufficient intelligible reason to reject" (p. 184).

This principle brings out an important element of the overall view: where citizens fail to converge on sufficient reasons or where some citizens have intelligible, sufficient reasons to reject a coercive law (they possess a defeater reason) no coercive law is publicly justifiable. This is a much weaker form of restraint than argued for by other public reason liberals. It also has important implications for the duties of citizens, legislators and judges in regard to their advocacy for coercive laws. In short, citizens basically have no duty of restraint in advocating for coercive laws because their public advocacy is rarely efficacious (hence, Vallier rejects any "duty of civility" as Rawls has defended). Legislators have a slightly stronger duty of restraint, they should only vote for laws that they justifiably believe are publicly justified (see PJP). Judges, in contrast, have a much stronger duty of restraint. In fact, they must make decisions in exercising judicial review according to reasons that are sharable by members of the public (p. 195). After the long arguments rejecting sharability that have come previously, this might come as quite a shock. The reason for this restrictive requirement for judges is their unique role in grounding future law, and so their judicial reasoning can authorize or prohibit certain kinds of coercion in the future.

As I said in the outset, this is a truly fantastic book. Vallier has broken new ground in public reason liberalism and provided serious alternative liberalism to those, like myself, who defend a consensus account of public reason. His work has already begun to reshape the conversation for those of us working on public reason.

Yet, despite my high praise, I find serious reasons to reject the convergence account of public reasons. My first concern is with the way that Vallier has specified the two desiderata by which to evaluate competing conceptions of justificatory reasons, integrity and diversity. In my view, he specifies these values too broadly and in so doing mischaracterizes the project of public reason liberalism.

I will focus on his characterization of "the fact of reasonable pluralism," which is quite distinct from Rawls's. It seems Vallier assumes the fact of reasonable pluralism to be a kind of natural fact about the world: pluralism of reasons obtains "when sincere, informed persons systematically and freely disagree about what is of ultimate value" (p. 89). In contrast, Rawls is clear that "the fact of reasonable pluralism" inevitably arises under very specific conditions -- namely, "within the framework of the free institutions of a constitutional regime." As such, liberals' concern with the fact of reasonable pluralism is not aimed at accommodating a fact external to liberal theory, that is, it is not taken as an independent fact by which we assess liberal theory as opposed to some other political theories. Rather, it raises the question as to whether liberalism is internally consistent. That is, given that liberal institutions will give rise to reasonable pluralism, the question arises as to whether it is nonetheless possible to find shared terms of social cooperation.[1]

Moreover, given the fact that reasonable pluralism, as opposed to mere pluralism, arises in the context of liberal democracies that institutionally protect freedom and the equality of citizens, Rawls's characterization of reasonable citizens entails that they are seeking terms of social cooperation that all can accept, and this means they endorse a principle of reciprocity and a principle of publicity.[2] That is, they antecedently accept a particular normative characterization of liberal polities -- as systems of fair social cooperation among free and equal citizens -- and that entails substantive normative commitments. The central point here is that citizens are aiming to justify the nature of their political relations to one another on terms that embody mutual respect, as political authority, and so legitimacy, is constituted by their relationship to one another. As such, Rawlsian political liberalism regards citizens as co-sovereigns (hence public reason is part of the idea of democracy itself, according to Rawls). This picture of justification differs from Vallier's account of what public justification is for as represented by the PJP. We can think of this as parallel to the standard social contract view that the contract is between citizens, and the government is necessary to institutionalize the terms of the contract. The contract is not between citizens and the government (or the institutions of political authority). Vallier's view tends to read as endorsing the latter kind of view, political authority must be justified to each citizen so as to authorize the relation between each citizen and the government -- that is, Vallier's convergence account regards citizens primarily as subjects (to whom laws must be justified). Hence, I am not persuaded that Vallier has given a neutral account of public justification by which to evaluate competing accounts of justificatory reasons.

Of course, it is open to Vallier to simply accept that his project is, indeed, different than Rawls's or other public reason liberals and to demand evaluation of it on its own terms. Does it best solve the problem as he describes it? This doesn't erase the problem, however. The motivation for the PJP, the need to justify coercion on terms acceptable to those over whom such coercive power is wielded, is driven by the recognition of the fact of reasonable pluralism, according to Vallier. "Reasonable pluralism is taken to motivate our need to justify coercion to others by their own lights" (p. 32). But without the understanding that reasonable pluralism presents itself under specific liberal institutions and so is constituted, in part, by a normative commitment to justify a particular kind of relationship among citizens, Vallier must specify the "reasonableness" of the pluralism in some other way and, in effect, does so in a much thinner way than does, say, Rawls.

Recall that Vallier defines reasonable agents as those that (i) "comply with publicly justified principles and offers intelligible reasons for her proposals," (ii) "recognizes the burdens of judgment" and (iii) "rejects repressing others reasonable points of view" (p. 163). In my view, this account of the reasonableness of persons is undermotivated because it is not tied to a commitment to liberal values and so is unmoored from a substantive account of what a society structured by fair terms of cooperation entails. In other words, Rawls is trying to articulate an account of justice that begins with substantive normative claims about the kind of project (creating a just society) citizens are engaged in. This project leads us to a consensus account of public reasons. Vallier is trying to justify coercion. Given that they have very different projects, they have very different accounts of what public justification is.

Relying on a bridging principle that connects a commitment to public justification to principles of exclusion and restraint such as respect for persons -- that Vallier earlier rejected -- is in fact the substantive ground of the principle of public justification. Vallier's attempt to sever a principle of public justification from a principle of exclusion (or an account of justificatory reasons as needing to be either shared or accessible) fails because our interest in preserving our own "natural" liberty is insufficient to motivate the concern that our "co-citizens" natural liberty and equality be not simply preserved but respected. Another way of capturing the core of my concern here is that I don't see how Vallier's project gets us beyond a mere modus vivendi (a nonmoral agreement to cooperate based on self-interest) and all the way to a moral agreement to honor the terms of social cooperation. Specifying our own interest in preserving our natural liberty doesn't entail concern or respect that "others" liberty and equality be preserved and respected. Such citizens may converge upon particular laws, but that doesn't make their agreement a moral one.

No doubt Vallier will have a reply to these concerns that will further develop and deepen the conversation. I look forward to it.


Thanks to Blain Neufeld for helpful comments.

[1] See, Johnathan Quong's Liberalism Without Perfectionism, (Oxford, 2014) Ch. 5 and Paul Weithman's Why Political Liberalism? (Oxford, 2010), Ch. 1.

[2] See, Rawls, "The Idea of Public Reason Revisited," in John Rawls: The Collected Works, ed. Samuel Freeman (Harvard University Press, 1999).